The Impossibility of Perfection: Aristotle, Feminism, and the Complexities of Ethic

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Michael Slote, The Impossibility of Perfection: Aristotle, Feminism, and the Complexities of Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2011, 167pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199790821.

Reviewed by Samantha Vice, Rhodes University


In The Impossibility of Perfection, Michael Slote argues that perfect happiness and virtue for humans is in principle impossible. This is because ethical phenomena are far more complex, and raise far more potential for conflict and failure in values, than philosophers have been willing to recognise. He defends a view of necessary imperfection and ethical complexity that is compatible with, and grounded in, the feminist care ethics he has defended in previous work.

Slote credits Isaiah Berlin with first expressing the view that ethical perfection is impossible, and along with feminism, Berlin is the inspiration for his investigation. Aiming to provide the arguments for the imperfection thesis that Berlin failed to, Slote's own approach depends on exploring in detail examples of conflicts between values, and from them drawing out the conceptual tools to further complicate the ethical realm. These tools are the many distinctions he draws within and between the categories of goods and virtues, all purporting to show that perfection of either virtue or happiness is impossible, because of the complex relations between values.

Slote's starting point in this task is the notion of 'dependent' values (where 'values' captures both virtues and personal goods) introduced in the first chapter. These are values whose virtuousness or goodness is dependent on the presence of another value. Conscientious adherence to duty, for instance, is only virtuous if one has "relatively humane or decent values to be conscientious about" (p. 21); sympathy counts as a good if it is not merely pity, but based on respect. This distinction is then complicated by a further notion that is crucial to the book's argument. Some values are 'paired opposites' and 'partial values': they necessarily work against each other, and they are not "univocally and unqualifiedly" values because "acting on either one of them will be ethically less than ideal" (p. 31).

The notion of partial values is established largely through a few examples, inspired by Slote's engagement with feminism and care ethics, to which he returns throughout. One is the clash that most adults have felt between pursuing intimate relationships and pursuing self-fulfillment through a career; another is the clash between the virtues of prudence and adventurousness, and the related goods of security and adventure. Committing oneself to a career lessens the possibility of having deep and close relationships; and if we choose adventure, we must give up some security and prudence. Another example, which carries great weight in the argument, is the opposition between frankness and tact. If one chooses tact, one is choosing to be less than completely honest; if one chooses frankness, one foregoes some kindness. Slote wants to say that these are all examples of paired, partial values, because they vie with and undercut each other. We lose something of value when choosing one over the other, and we cannot instantiate both.

The conflict between partial values is necessary, rather than practical, and it demonstrates, Slote thinks, that perfection in both the realms of virtue and happiness is impossible. If one necessarily has to forego one of a paired set of personal goods or virtues, one cannot be perfectly happy or perfectly virtuous. Unlike Aristotle, then, who thought that when virtues, at least, conflict, there will always be an overall right answer, Slote thinks that when partial values conflict, one's choice will be lacking in either virtue or the goods that bring happiness. Like many, he therefore rejects the ancient doctrine of the unity of the virtues -- that if an agent has one virtue, she has them all.

More categories and distinctions within the realm of partial values are explored in the final chapter and used to further complicate the ethical realm. With admirable patience, Slote takes the reader through 'intracategorial' and 'transcategorial' dependencies -- dependencies within goods and values, or across them; 'transpersonal' and 'intrapersonal' dependencies -- whether or not a value "crosses the boundary between persons" (p. 108); 'transvalent' dependencies -- whether virtues depend on vices, or goods on evils for their value; and 'deviant and 'variant' forms of activities and ideals -- those that are distortions or variations of an ideal.

Many of these distinctions are sensible and Slote's readers will have no trouble concluding with him that the ethical realm is certainly complicated. However, the reader who steps back from the particular examples and proliferation of distinctions and asks about the context and significance of the conclusions will be disappointed. We are not told, for instance, why the theses of the unity of the virtues and the possibility of perfection were thought plausible to begin with. Why are philosophers attracted to them, when just a little experience of life seems to cast them into doubt? What, theoretically and practically, is at stake here so that philosophers are still drawn to conclusions opposed to Slote's? Slote does not provide much in the way of a philosophical motivation for and against the imperfection thesis. This is particularly pressing because his examples are suggestive rather than conclusive, and his conclusions could be more solidly defended by showing the counter-intuitive or theoretically unsatisfactory nature of his opponents' views.

Throughout The Impossibility of Perfection, the reader misses a broader theoretical context to provide grounds and significance to Slote's many distinctions and examples. Allowing examples to carry most of the argumentative weight is a risky strategy when there is room for reasonable disagreement in the interpretations of examples and the theoretical conclusions one draws from them. As Slote admits, Aristotelians could argue that in the choice between prudence and adventure, or between tact and frankness, there can be an overall right choice, "not open to moral or ethical criticism" (p. 41), and so partial virtues (and goods) do not clash as such. Some might interpret tact as a particular, gentle way of being honest, rather than as an opposing virtue to frankness; or prudence as compatible with adventurousness, if we distinguish that from rashness or foolhardiness. Although Slote insists on the importance for ethics of nuanced examples, those he provides cannot settle the issue of whether perfect happiness or virtue is possible.

Theoretical considerations that might persuade the reader to Slote's point of view when intuitions over examples differ are generally rather thin on the ground, and the details that philosophers will crave tend to be relegated to footnotes. While Chapters 2, 3 and 4, and the interesting Appendix, provide more theoretical nuance, examples still carry most of the weight. In these chapters, Slote argues against the doctrine of the unity of the virtues more directly; distinguishes his views from some related ones; and explores moral cost and moral dilemmas, which we might think "count as a confirming instance" of the "thesis of necessary virtue-imperfection" (p. 74). Situations in which whatever one does, one does wrong, or incurs some serious moral cost, do not, Slote thinks, necessarily bring along with them the imperfection thesis. Relying on the philosopher's favourite, Sophie's Choice, as an example of a moral dilemma, he argues that the disposition to be willing to choose one child over another in such circumstances is not "ethically criticisable" (p. 76). In contrast, someone who is disposed to be tactful rather than frank, or prudent rather than adventurous is ethically criticisable. He concludes that the only way to the imperfection thesis is through the notion of partial values.

These conclusions and examples are of course contentious. Some might think that a good parent could not have the disposition to choose one child over another, even in such a dire situation as Sophie's, and think that this is part of the point of Sophie's consequent suffering. Slote's way of distinguishing partial values from dilemmas could therefore be disputed. However, the theoretical considerations in favour of his views are again missing. This would have been a place to explore what is at stake if one accepts, while distinguishing from each other, moral dilemmas and the necessary imperfection entailed by partial values.

In general, the significance of Slote’s conclusion that perfection is in principle impossible is, though frequently stated, not spelled out. Is he, for instance, attracted to a kind of particularism on the basis of the complexity he explores and thinks leads to the imperfection thesis? His views about the complex relations between values could be akin to the relations between reasons explored in the literature on particularism. If not, what more does his view entail for a viable virtue ethics besides a rejection of the doctrine of the unity of the virtues? What are the implications for our practical deliberations and evaluations of character and actions? He states repeatedly that his view gives us a more complex and nuanced view of ethical phenomena, but how exactly does it complicate the ethical realm and our philosophical reflections on ethics? Slote does not say, though his commitment to care ethics suggests, at least, that many of the debates that exercise consequentialists, deontologists and particularists, and that might naturally be raised by his views in this book, are not in his sights.

Throughout The Impossibility of Perfection, Slote moves freely between speaking of virtues and speaking of goods, and we might also wonder whether what applies to one kind of value applies equally to the other. Whatever you think of the unity of the virtues and the possibility of aretaic perfection, must admitting a plurality of good ways to live necessarily lead to imperfect happiness? Slote tries in Chapter 3 to answer various objections to his view. He insists that parceling out different values to different parts of life, or alternating between paired partial values, or appealing to the notion of organic wholes, will not rid us of the fact that we are still missing out on something, a thought which makes it impossible to think of our lives as perfectly happy.

This, however, seems the wrong way to think about happiness. In a footnote (p. 148, n. 8) Slote emphasises that the argument for the impossibility of perfect happiness works only for paired, partial goods, not a pluralism of goods more generally. However, it is not obvious even here that one must understand perfect happiness in terms of possessing every (paired, partial) good. That one must choose between values does not itself mean one cannot be happy. Insofar as -- per impossibile -- one can be perfectly happy, one can be perfectly happy leading a quiet and unadventurous life; it depends on one's character and situation. Giving up something in this realm does not mean one has necessarily lost out on happiness. Perfect happiness, insofar as the notion makes sense at all in a mortal world, is plausibly thought of as perfect within the limits imposed by one's capacities and choices. We have certain temperaments and talents that lead us to make choices out of a huge variety, all of which are only theoretically open to us. Each one of us could probably not be happy in all the ways that it is open to humans to be.

Doing the work in this discussion is an objective-list theory of wellbeing, although Slote hopes that his conclusions are compatible with hedonistic and preference-satisfaction accounts. Perhaps, however, the objective-list theory generates a problem of perfection where other theories do not, because it suggests that if we lack something on the list we must be less than perfectly happy, and because there is scope for reasonable disagreement about what should be on the list. Alternatively, self-reflective satisfaction on the basis of knowledge of one's temperament and capacities seems a good contender for happiness. If one is reflectively and self-knowledgeably content with one's peaceful and prudent life, admitting the value of adventure but content to leave it to others, why think of this as an imperfection of happiness? More is not necessarily better here; one does not have to have every possible value -- whether paired and partial or not -- to count as living a happy life. This is another point at which more engagement with what is theoretically at stake would have been helpful.

Throughout all these explorations, Slote returns repeatedly to care ethics and feminism, which he credits with leading him to complicate his views on ethics. In Chapter 5, he defends a form of care ethics that does not privilege traditionally feminine over traditionally masculine ways of being, instead seeing the traditionally gender-specified values of security and adventure, relationships and careers, for instance, as equally important for anyone, and raising for anyone the conflict that he explores earlier. He suggests, without developing it, that the form of care ethics to which he is drawn would address both moral and more broadly ethical questions about virtues and goods, and that it would show "the relevance of care ethics to issues of justice and autonomy" (p. 92), those values often labeled as masculine and repudiated by some care ethicists. This means, for example, "emphasizing both relationships and career fulfilment in spelling out the moral aims or goals of caring" (pp. 92-3) and, more generally, allowing into care ethics what has traditionally been thought of as a distinctive 'masculine' moral voice. This is, again, a sensible suggestion, but how exactly the result would give us a distinctive ethics is not explained, though he sends the reader to his other work for an answer.

The lack of theoretical detail and engagement with the more fundamental philosophical issues underlying Slote's concerns makes it difficult to gauge the intended audience of the book. The jaunty and conversational tone, the lack of theoretical detail, suggests a more general audience, but Slote then fails to tell his readers why they should worry about what most of them will shrug their shoulders over. Despite some fascinating discussions (for instance in the Appendix) and plausible suggestions, philosophers will also come out feeling rather dissatisfied. Ultimately, Slote's concern is to undermine the assumption, shared by all major ethical traditions, that "ethical phenomena can be understood in a unified harmonious way that allows for the possibility (in principle) of perfection" (p. 4), either "under the aegis of reason" (p. 100) or emotion. We can agree with him that ethics and the lives we try to lead under its guidance are complicated; in what way exactly, and why it matters to us as agents and as philosophers, is however not yet clear.