The Inconspicuous God: Heidegger, French Phenomenology, and the Theological Turn

Placeholder book cover

Jason W. Alvis, The Inconspicuous God: Heidegger, French Phenomenology, and the Theological Turn, Indiana University Press, 2018, 249pp. $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253033321.

Reviewed by Bernard Prusak, King's College, Pennsylvania


We seem to live in an age, at least in the so-called Global North, from which God has withdrawn or is fast withdrawing. Consider, for example, that slightly more than half of U.S. adults raised as Catholics have left the church at some point. About one in five of those adults returned to the church, but two-thirds no longer consider themselves Catholic in any way, and half became disaffiliated from religion altogether. That is, they joined the growing number of "nones," currently nearing one quarter of U.S. adults, which is around the same number of U.S. Catholics in a population of 325 million. The trend toward disaffiliation is most pronounced among millennials, people who reached adulthood after 2000. All told, around a third of millennials identify as nones. In a 2014 survey, 60 percent of millennials raised as Catholics reported never praying or attending church. Equally telling, Georgetown University's Center for Applied Research in the Apostolate reports that church marriages have declined nearly 300 percent since 1970.[1] And while it has been found that teens raised in more conservative or self-styled orthodox Catholic households are somewhat more likely to practice into adulthood than are teens from more liberal Catholic households, even enthusiasts for conservative Catholicism acknowledge that it has proved "a preservationist enterprise more than a dynamic one" inasmuch as it has "limited decline without producing impressive new growth."[2]

There are many factors contributing to the growth of religious disaffiliation. One is the association of religion with countercultural, reactionary politics.[3] People weakly attached to religion have increasingly become other than religious as prominent religious leaders have condemned and sought to turn back movements of personal liberation.[4] Another is the breakdown of the "ecology" of institutions that served to transmit religious faith from one generation to the next.[5] A third, which is less amenable to social scientific research, may be that many of us no longer have any context for the name 'God' and no longer can even fathom what a "religious experience" might be. Against this background, the Czech theologian Tomás Halík has suggested that, "If there is something that might be described as the religious experience of modern man, then it is the experience of God's hiddenness."[6]

Jason W. Alvis's book opens with the assertion that "God is not a spectacle" (1). Alvis presents this assertion as contrary to the expectations of what he calls "our present society of the spectacle" (49), according to which "The greater degree of spectacle . . . the more sacred an event becomes and the closer to divinity" (1). It seems right to say that his book is built on the basic conviction that "religious experiences, more often than not, take place in mundane, everyday life" (8). Otherwise put, "Christ knocking Saul to the ground and speaking audibly to him notwithstanding, the majority of today's revelations or religious experiences are not bedazzling, and occur to ordinary people in the hustle and grind of everyday life" (33). Unfortunately, and strangely for a book concerned with phenomenology, Alvis provides no examples of such revelations or religious experiences. The question, "Like what?" finds no answer. If "inconspicuousness is an essential means by which God 'gives Godself'" (4), it is only fitting that revelations or religious experiences should be difficult to discern. What else, though, is phenomenology about than uncovering what tends to be covered over?

The book consists of a long introduction, eight chapters, and a brief conclusion. Heidegger's thought figures in all the chapters; chapter 2 is focused on his late reflections on the phenomenology of the inapparent. Every other chapter, except chapter 5 on the thought of Jean-Luc Nancy, is concerned with figures associated with what Dominique Janicaud called the theological turn of French phenomenology;[7] Alvis speaks of "Janicaud's blacklist of phenomenologists who have hijacked phenomenology for theological purposes" (142). Chapter 1 focuses on the work of Jean-Luc Marion, chapter 3 Michel Henry, chapter 4 Jean-Yves Lacoste, chapter 6 Janicaud himself, chapter 7 Jean-Louis Chrétien, and chapter 8 Emmanuel Levinas. The chapters stand more or less independently of one another; Alvis's stated aim for each is to use the "notion of inconspicuousness to take the work of each of these thinkers one small step further toward describing the phenomenality of God" (4). What makes a phenomenon inconspicuous, in his usage, is that it "furnishes enough data for the experience of it, yet in a way that eludes direct comprehension" (19). Other stated aims of the book as a whole include "to describe in greater detail the generative relation between Heidegger and those phenomenologists in France associated with the 'Theological Turn'" (2) and "to employ inconspicuousness to issue a challenge within phenomenology to retrieve evidences unique to the description of religious experiences" (3).

It makes sense that chapter 1 is concerned with Marion: his account of the saturated phenomenon, which overwhelms the field of experience and cannot be grasped or organized, contrasts directly with Alvis's conviction that "some forms of revelation have small beginnings that operate incrementally, slowly, and therefore often inconspicuously" (50). (Alas, like what?) Alvis takes from Marion the lesson that, "although revelation clearly gives, it does not give clearly" (44): in an overwhelming experience, neither what is revealed is altogether clear, nor that it is even revelation. Hence, even in the aftermath of such an experience, there is both the possibility of and need for faith. Alvis notes, however, that "Marion does not develop how it is in the inconspicuous and the ordinary that revelation also can occur" (47). At the risk of repetition, that account is unfortunately lacking in this book, too. The chapters are all concerned with texts, and often with whether they get Heidegger right (Alvis takes issue in this regard with Henry and Lacoste), not phenomena.

In chapter 6, on Janicaud, Alvis at last clarifies what he means by religion, experience, and religious experience. Religion is "the being-open-to the fundamental and effortful relation between oneself and what one takes to be a personal, meaning-giving, and life changing potential"; experience is "latching-onto-as-meaningful particular circumstances in the steady stream of consciousness"; and religious experience is, then, "the momentary capturing of the intelligibility of data that is part and parcel of . . . efforts of being-open to . . . meaning-giving, life changing, and personal potential" (173). Alvis claims that "It is only throughout the course of one's life of living religiously that the evidences of those experiences become intelligible" (173), which, it can be hoped, he might flesh out in a future study of exemplary religious figures.

Though there is much talk about the possible modes of givenness of God, what we are to understand by the name 'God' is nowhere discussed. Alvis does distance himself from "traditional notions of God as a luminous one" (9), and it is clear he wants to avoid ontotheology, which is to say fashioning God to fit into and play a role in a philosophical system, typically as causa sui (21). He also puts aside the question of the existence of God. "Does it not make sense," he asks, "to conceive of the manifold ways in which God could be given to thought prior to attempting to determine whether or not God exists? This could be a productive means to theological thinking" (201). It is puzzling, however, how such an exercise is not already "theological thinking." For presumably we need some conception of God before we could conceive of the ways God could be given to thought. Alvis's framework is Christian -- he occasionally cites Paul or at least Pauline letters -- but he does not engage with the work of any theologians, Christian or otherwise. It is also noteworthy that he does not grapple with the problems of evil and sin, which is to say the ways that human existence might be closed if not hostile to religious experience.

Perhaps Alvis's reluctance to engage theologians is rooted in a commitment to keeping philosophy separate from theology, lest Janicaud be proven right that Marion et al. stand guilty of "the abuse of phenomenological language to do the science of theology" (14). Alvis asks at one point, "can phenomenology say anything putatively new about religion and God that is not reducible to previously held beliefs, or . . . mere speculation?" (58) His book does not give reason to think that the answer is "yes, phenomenology can". But it does leave open the possibility that phenomenology might throw valuable light on the lives of people who persist in living religiously in this age of growing religious disaffiliation. Is experience of God's hiddenness more than a paradox or an oxymoron? Is experience of God's hiddenness nonetheless experience of God? One way or the other, surely the phenomenologist must hear from theologians in order to speak intelligently to this question.

[1] These figures are available at:


Caryle Murphy, "Half of U.S. Adults Raised Catholic Have Left the Church at Some Point", Pew Research Center, September 15, 2015.


Michael Hout, "Saint Peter's Leaky Boat: Falling Intergenerational Persistence among U.S.-Born Catholics since 1974," Sociology of Religion 77/1 (2016): 1-17, at 2 and 9-10.


Pew Research Center, "'Nones' on the Rise", October 9, 2012.

Center for Applied Research in the Apostolate, "Frequently Requested Church Statistics. The numbers are 426,309 in 1970 and 144,148 in 2017. Over the same period, weekly mass attendance is down from 48 percent to 23 percent.

Christian Smith et al., Young Catholic America: Emerging Adults in, out of, and Gone from the Church (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014), 83-84.

[2] Ross Douthat, To Change the Church: Pope Francis and the Future of Catholicism (New York: Simon and Schuster, 2018), 28. Notwithstanding, Douthat clings to the claim that there is "strong historical correlation between progressive theology and institutional decline" (191). Yet it is not only Saint Peter's bark that is leaking. Both white Mainline Protestants and more recently white evangelicals have seen significant declines. White Mainline Protestants accounted for around 28 percent of the U.S. population in 1973. In 2016, that was down to 13 percent. White evangelicals accounted for 23 percent in 1973, then as much as 28 percent in the mid-1990s. But in 2016 that number had fallen to 17 percent. See Robert D. Putnam and David E. Campbell, American Grace: How Religion Divides Us and Unites Us (New York: Simon and Schuster, 2010), 105, and Daniel Cox and Robert P. Jones, America's Changing Religious Identity: Findings from the 2016 American Values Atlas (Washington, DC: Public Religion Research Institute, 2017), 7.

[3] See Michael Hout and Claude S. Fischer, "Why More Americans Have No Religious Preference: Politics and Generations," American Sociological Review 67 (2002): 165-190, at 179. As Hout and Fischer write, it appears that "the cause-effect relationship linking religion and politics" became reciprocal in the U.S. in the 1990s (ibid.).

[4] Hout and Fischer, "Why More Americans Have No Religious Preference," 178, characterizing the quarrel of unchurched believers as "not with God, but with people running organized religion." See further Charles Taylor, A Secular Age (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2007), 502-503.

[5] See Rita Ferrone, "Religious Education -- Broken?", Commonweal, January 25, 2017.

[6] Tomás Halík, I Want You to Be: On the God of Love, trans. Gerald Turner (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2016), 36.

[7] Dominique Janicaud, Le tournant théologique de la phénomenologie française (Combas: L'Eclat 1991); The Theological Turn of French Phenomenology, trans. Bernard G. Prusak, in Phenomenology and the "Theological" Turn: The French Debate (New York: Fordham University Press, 2000), 16-103.