The Inessential Indexical: On the Philosophical Insignificance of Perspective and the First Person

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Herman Cappelen and Josh Dever, The Inessential Indexical: On the Philosophical Insignificance of Perspective and the First Person, Oxford University Press, 2013, 194pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199686742.

Reviewed by Tomis Kapitan, Northern Illinois University


This crisp, lean, and tightly argued study deserves the attention of anyone interested in the topics of indexicality, perspective, and the first person. Those who are sympathetic with the authors' skepticism that indexical representations are essential within semantics, philosophy of mind, epistemology, or action theory will be pleased with the fresh scrutiny provided, while those partial to the indispensability of indexicals should welcome the occasion to sharpen their own views and argumentation. My prediction is that this fine book will significantly advance the debate about the place of perspective and indexicality in human thought and action.

Chapters 1 and 2 establish the framework for the subsequent discussions, introducing the idea that indexicality and perspectivality are "philosophically deep" because they make available "ways of representing the world that are not available with non-perspectival devices" (1). The book's primary, albeit "modest," goal is to show that the leading proponents of this view, John Perry and David Lewis, have neither articulated nor defended a well-defined thesis of essential indexicality. The authors believe that they have also taken an important step toward the more "ambitious" goal of proving that perspective and indexicality are "philosophically shallow" (5).

Chapters 3 and 4 consider whether Perry has shown first-person thoughts to have a special explanatory role concerning action, pointing out that his arguments turn on the inability to substitute for indexicals within action-explanations. Because there are adequate indexical-free explanations of actions that are also opaque, and opacity offers no grounds for the alleged distinctiveness of indexicals, the authors conclude that Perry failed to show indexicals to be necessary or unique. Chapters 5 and 6 address Lewis's account of essential indexicality in terms of the de se ascriptions of properties and centered worlds, arguing that Lewis's two gods case is "just another instance of Frege's puzzle" and provides no evidence for an irreducible de se.[1] Moreover, the Lewisonian approach is not aided by a recourse to functionalism.

Having undermined the main defenses of essential indexicality from the "Perry-Lewis tradition," the authors address the immunity to error through misidentification (chapter 7), the perspectival nature of perceptual content (chapter 8), and the semantics of PRO constructions (chapter 9). As regards each, the case for essential indexicality falls short; there is no such immunity to error, perceptual content need not be expressed indexically, and the PRO constructions do not provide "clear cut data" favoring a de se interpretation. A slightly more passionate final chapter argues that while real enough, perspectivality and indexicality are indicative of our epistemic limitations, and "make the best sense when placed within a general picture of content as objective representation of the world" (182).

Selected Argumentation

I will focus upon Cappelen and Dever's treatment of essential indexicality as concerns action, perceptual content and semantics. Those hoping to learn about their criticisms of Lewis and of immunity to error claims are invited to work through chapters 5-7 on their own or examine other reviews.

Chapter 3, perhaps "the most important chapter in this book" (18), observes that Perry's arguments establish nothing more than that indexical expressions cannot be substituted by non-indexical expressions in action explanations salva veritate, thereby linking his case for the essential indexical to the treatment of opacity. But action explanations are generally opaque, as evidenced by third-person counterparts of the puzzles made famous by Perry, Lewis, and Arthur Prior (61-69). So, are there any grounds for thinking that indexicals are somehow unique as regards opacity? The most likely place to look for an argument of this sort is within the Fregean tradition, not only because the leading competitors accord indexicality no special place (70), but because the usual Fregean treatment in terms of a difference in sense does not readily apply to indexicals. Throughout chapter 4 the authors argue that the case for a Fregean distinctiveness of indexicals falls short. On the one hand, construals of indexicals as lacking descriptive senses fail; besides being mere variants of Kripke's criticisms of Frege concerning names, they make it a "mystery" how indexicals can have non-constant (variable) characters (16, 78). On the other hand, no one has succeeded in making the case for distinctiveness within the Fregean framework by introducing more "robust" senses (71, 79).

To be fair, Perry did not argue that indexicals are essential because of opacity; opacity is merely symptomatic of the indispensable role that indexically expressed belief-states play in producing action. The real issue is whether actions can be explained without recourse to indexicals, specifically, whether actions can be motivated and rationalized without the first-person states to which Perry-type arguments standardly appeal. Here the authors contend that because differences in behavior can be traced to non-indexical beliefs, self-representation is not a feature of all action-explanations, and even if it is, it need not be indexical. In operating a fax machine, for example, I press buttons by moving my fingers in various ways. I need information about where the buttons are relative to myself, but at "the cognitive representation level" I need only represent the buttons and "their objective position in space," not myself or my bodily parts (43).

The authors propose an alternative account of action that describes the contents of one's desires, beliefs, and intentions as third-personal, some of which do not involve oneself as an agent. To explain which of a wide range of desires, beliefs, and intentions rationalize and produce action, the authors propose that each intention serves as an input into an action-inventory -- a "range of actions" the agent has the physiological and psychological ability to perform -- and yields behavior whenever its content "matches" an item in the inventory. Failing a match, the intention does not motivate or rationalize anything. The inventory actions do not even have to be thought of, let alone specified first-personally, and the agent need not be apprised of a match in order for action to ensue (50-54).

Chapter 8 examines the thesis that if there is any irreducible de se (or other indexical) content anywhere, then it is to be found in perception. In basing a modus tollens on this conditional, the authors argue that while it is "natural" to use indexicals in describing our perceptual contents, it is never necessary to do so. For example, if Sophia exclaims, "I hear sound S coming from my right," she could also have described the content of her experience with, "Sophia hears sound S coming from Sophia's right." Another perceiver, Maeve, might also hear sound S to her right and declare "I hear sound S coming from my right." The similarity of their contents can be displayed with indexical-free "x hears S coming from x's right" format, with no implication of any "deeply de se" content. Imagine, further, that Maeve's sensation is parasitic upon Brigid's due to a device that sends signals from Brigid to Maeve's brain. Then not only is Maeve's content phenomenologically indistinguishable from Sophia's, but the position of the sound vis-à-vis Maeve does not enter into its truth-conditions (145). Even if her perceptual content is relational, with herself as a "hidden" relatum (148, 180), she need not represent herself or any part of her body indexically.

Some linguists have urged that PRO constructions provide evidence for essential indexicality (chapter 9). Consider, the occurrence of 'expects to' in

(1) John expects to win the election.

which, if John is a pessimistic candidate, is false. However,

(2) John expects that he will win the election.

might be true if, while intoxicated, John watches a televised campaign speech and comes to think that the speaker -- none other than himself -- will win. One way to explain this difference is to note that (1), unlike (2), has the logical form,

(3) John expects PRO to win the election.

and the claim is that the implicit subject can only be read in a first-person way.

Cappelen and Dever deny that PRO constructions are "clear cut" evidence of a mandatory first-person reading. If John, too drunk to recognize himself on screen, gestures toward it and declares, "That guy's going to be our next mayor!" it would be correct for someone to react: "Can you believe it? John's so drunk he actually expects to win the election." This is evidence that a first-person reading of expectation reports is not required (163-64), and the same holds of other PRO constructions. These observations are coupled with an interesting pragmatic account of when a locution such as "A expects A to win" is more appropriate than "A expects to win."

Some Concerns

While Cappelen and Dever raise serious challenges to claims of essential indexicality, it is not easy to assess their progress toward the ambitious goal. For one thing, 'content,' 'objective,' 'information,' 'perception', and 'represents' are not precisely defined, a problem considering that each term has different uses or senses in philosophical English. For another, while perspectivality and indexicality are distinguished, it is sometimes hard to determine whether remarks concerning one carry over to the other. Finally, while notions of consciousness, experience, and subjectivity pervade a good deal of argumentation about essential indexicality, they are not featured in this book, and the authors' preference for information and representation makes comparisons difficult.

Regarding 'content,' there is a distinction in philosophical literature between

(i) the immediate contents of experiences (sensory, interoceptive, introspective), and

(ii) the conceptualizations constituting our "cognitive representations" (43), roughly, what we entertain when we judge, believe, wonder, doubt, intend, and so forth.

Following David Kaplan, the authors also speak of 'content' as

(iii) the truth-conditional representations of sentences (in context),

though they leave open whether these are best viewed as structured propositions, sets of worlds, functions from worlds to truth-values, etc. (15-16).

Minimally, perspective exists at level (i) insofar as sensory data are spatially and temporally oriented toward a certain region occupied by the perceiver. Moreover, that a sound comes from the perceiver's right, for example, is immediately given rather than a product of conceptualizing activity. As such, perspective is an intrinsic feature of certain sorts of events, namely, our experiences, in virtue of which what is immediate is representative of our spatial and temporal relationships to things and events. But then perspective is itself objective, not merely a matter of the way things "seem" (1), a fact not quite captured by describing it in terms of our "regrettable" epistemic limitations (181).

Indexicality, by contrast, belongs at level (ii), for it is how we conceptualize the world by exploiting what is immediate. Nothing is given as this or that, now or then, and nothing is intrinsically a she, a you, or an I. Indexicality arises in our reaction to perspectivality, and while it entails perspectivality the converse does not hold. I am not sure whether Cappelen and Dever would agree with this Castañeda-like depiction. While they concede that indexicality is a real phenomenon (180), they also claim that there is no need for "first-person" or "demonstrative" concepts in understanding the context-sensitivity of indexical expressions (16), and that "Whatever can be expressed indexically could be expressed by non-indexical means" (143).

This said, consider perceptual content. The authors correctly observe that there are perceptions whose contents are not irreducibly de se (first personal). Perhaps most of our experiences are not conceptualized at all, let alone indexically. Still, sensory content remains perspectival. When I hear a bell-like sound off to my right, it is more accurate to describe the sound as coming from a position than being at a position. There is an evident relational structure here wherein the region identified as "to my right" is connected with the region occupied by myself or by my auditory receptors. Although the latter are not separately identified, they remain within that content, hidden, yes, but only in the sense of being nonidentified and unarticulated rather than absent.

At the level of cognitive representation, indexicals do not have to be used in describing experience. Instead of reporting that "I hear the sound of a bell coming from my right," I might say "TK hears the sound of a bell coming from TK's right." But is the same information expressed? If so, why might I believe the former without believing the latter? How do we deal with the Mach-Castañeda type examples where,

(4) John saw that the candidate is making a speech.

is true whereas,

(5) John saw that he himself is making a speech.

is false, or that,

(6) Lingens believes that he himself is lost

is true when Lingens does not believe the same of Lingens under any third-person identification? Again, how could someone identify items indexically yet be unable to do so in non-indexical terms, e.g., someone with an impaired short-term memory who, when floating in a large darkened weightless chamber, thinks It is quiet here now?

Cappelen and Dever might reply that such examples are more instances of opacity, and remind us that they have neither offered a theory of opacity nor produced non-indexical synonyms for indexicals (81). Fair enough, but then they have not accounted for the cognitive significance of indexically expressed observations and beliefs in non-indexical terms, or explained the apparently ineliminability of the quasi-indicator 'he himself' in the attitude-attributions of (5) and (6). Indexicality, it seems, remains essential to the fine-grained distinctions within our cognitive representations.[2]

Perhaps the cognitive-psychological role of indexicals is not sufficiently "deep" because indexicality is kept out of truth-functional content. Yet, even this is suspect if truth-conditions cannot be specified in non-indexical terms. For instance, one might think it a simple matter to say that S's utterance at t of I am in Texas is true iff S is in Texas at t. But reliable truth-conditions must support entailments, and given that S's I am in Texas entails Some self-conscious being is in Texas we have a problem, for S's being in Texas does not guarantee the latter's truth. Cappelen and Dever resist a strategy of locating indexicality within truth-conditional content, though, beyond a footnote, they do not elaborate.[3]

These points about perspectivality and indexicality carry over to action. True, many actions can be explained without recourse to indexical representations, not only our automatic or habitual actions of walking or driving, but novel undertakings like operating a fax machine. Yet, perspective still abounds. How else am I to determine where the buttons are except by perceived direction and distance from myself, relying not only on visual and tactile vectors but also upon kinesthetic and proprioceptive awareness of my own body?

Indexicality enters with the cognitive representation of certain actions. This is most apparent in deliberation -- a phenomenon the authors do not discuss -- where we confront competing desire-belief sets, each of which has already found a "match" in the action-inventory. We explicitly represent the alternatives and compare their respective merits in the course of making up our mind. What is the content of the resultant intention? When Margo decides to play tennis, for example, what she intends is not merely an action type indexed to a time, but an undertaking of that action type. Whose undertaking? Her own, it seems. It is strange to say that I could intend to undertake Saul Kripke's action of releasing his unpublished papers (50). I might desire and intend to do something that would cause Kripke to release his papers, or to shine his shoes, but to perform his actions?

Maybe the language of 'intends' is just another PRO construction and 'Margo intends' should be treated along the lines of 'John expects' (above). But the authors' handling of the PRO data is questionable, e.g., their third person reading of "Can you believe it? John's so drunk he actually expects to win the election." To my ears, this report is false given the accompanying narrative, just as it would be mistaken to describe Dr. Jekyll's resolution to reform by saying that "Dr. Jekyll intends Mr. Hyde to cease becoming Mr. Hyde." Perhaps the authors have a response, but their brief foray into action theory leaves me guessing.

If we cannot separate intending from the first-person, then indexicality is essential for deliberation, choice, and, likely, for intentional action as such. If, in turn, the ability to act intentionally is the ground for possessing obligations and being subject to sanctions, then the justification for normative codes depends upon the capacity for first-person thoughts. The emotions of pride, honor, envy, embarrassment, regret, and shame seem even more intimately first-personal. When we reflect on the behavior to which they have led, it is difficult to avoid the conclusion that however indexicality is to be explained, the explanandum is "philosophically deep."

[1] The authors point out that 'de se' is used promiscuously, enhancing the dangers of "confusion and obfuscation." Although Lewis introduced the locution by saying that the "Self-ascription of properties, might suitably be called belief or knowledge de se" (The Philosophical Review, 1979, 521), the standard practice has been to use 'de se' synonymously with 'first-person' or 'first-personal,' abstracting, thereby, from Lewis's description.

[2] A discussion of Castañeda's work might have helped here because he not only argued for the irreducibility of indexicality within propositional content, but carefully distinguished his views from those of Perry, Lewis, and Kaplan. There are even more radical forms of essential indexicality that might have been considered, e.g., the Peirce-Whitehead claim that every proposition representing the actual world contains indexical elements, or the proposal that indexicals play an indispensable psychological role in identifying objects. For example, even if there is no indexical content in the meaning of 'The Eiffel Tower,' it may well be that I cannot come to understand its reference without indexical identifications, e.g., that tower over there, or the structure depicted in this blueprint, etc.

[3] In a footnote on page 80, the authors claim that the strategy would implausibly entail that the "full semantics of the language" cannot be specified "at one time, or in one place, or by one person." They are correct if giving "the full semantics of the language" requires specifying the truth-conditions for each token. But this objection fails if semantics is confined to types, for even if particularized indexical modes are required to interpret indexical tokens (thus, Castañeda), a semantics for indexical types can be rendered in general terms.