The Inheritance of Wealth: Justice, Equality, and the Right to Bequeath

The Inheritance Of Wealth Justice Equality And The Right To Bequeath Book Cover

Daniel Halliday, The Inheritance of Wealth: Justice, Equality, and the Right to Bequeath, Oxford University Press, 2018, 235pp., $45.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803355.

Reviewed by Blain Neufeld, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


A significant obstacle to the realization of the free and equal status of all citizens within democratic societies is the inheritance of wealth -- or more precisely, the intergenerational accumulation and transfer of wealth within families. The extreme wealth inequality caused by flows of inheritances can render a de jure democratic society a de facto aristocracy, wherein individuals' life-prospects are determined largely by the economic class into which they are born. Because of this, liberal egalitarian justice demands limits on inheritances. John Rawls, for instance, recommends that intergenerational bequeathments and gifts be taxed, so that individuals can acquire only limited amounts of wealth through such processes over the courses of their lifetimes.[1]

Rawls's treatment of inheritance is quite brief, and there has been little discussion of the topic by other egalitarian philosophers over the two decades since the publication of Justice as Fairness: A Restatement. This is surprising, given our "new Gilded Age" of extreme wealth inequality.[2] Thankfully, Daniel Halliday's excellent book helps to fill this lacuna. Of special philosophical interest is Halliday's attempt to integrate elements of "luck egalitarianism" within a "social egalitarian" framework. This endeavour is both misguided and unnecessary -- or so I shall suggest below. I nonetheless recommend this book enthusiastically to anyone interested in questions of distributive justice. Hopefully it will prompt further examination and debate of this important topic.


The first chapter of Halliday's book provides an overview of its main themes and theses. A primary concern is "economic segregation." In an economically segregated society: (a) individuals belong to groups that are distinguished by different levels of wealth (say, the "top 1%" versus the "next 19%" versus the next four quintiles); (b) there is little movement by individuals between groups during their lives; and (c) members of different groups enjoy different levels of opportunities (educational, professional, etc.) and political power. Liberal egalitarian justice requires the elimination, insofar as it is feasible, of entrenched class hierarchy. The arbitrary inequalities among citizens based on the economic groups into which they are born violates liberal justice in much the same way as group-based inequalities based upon race, sex, sexual orientation, and religion.

The book also aims to integrate two rival views of egalitarian justice. Halliday's liberal egalitarian framework is novel in that it is a social egalitarian one that purports to incorporate certain core luck egalitarian ideas. He claims that "neither approach works especially well if used alone but that they work well when combined in the right way" (p .5). (As I explain later, I do not think that this integrative project is successful; however, I also do not think it is necessary for Halliday's other main positions.)

A third key claim of the book is that liberal egalitarianism can best address the problem of inherited wealth via what Halliday refers to as the "Rignano scheme" (this scheme is drawn from the early twentieth-century work of the Italian theorist Eugenio Rignano). According to the Rignano scheme, "inheritance can be taxed at a greater rate when it rolls over -- when it gets passed down more than once" (p. 7). What this means, roughly, is that if Albert creates 100 dollars of wealth during his lifetime, he should be able to bequeath most of that to his daughter Beth. However, if Beth retains most of that wealth, say 80 dollars, much of that (perhaps all) should be taxed away if she bequeaths it to her son Cassius (so Cassius would receive little or nothing in second-generation inheritance). The low tax rate imposed on only the initial transfer has two justifications. First, it gives Albert an incentive to work hard (so that he can pass on some wealth to Beth), but it also creates an incentive for Beth to avoid idleness (since she must create new wealth if she wishes to bequeath any to Cassius). Second, the Rignano scheme may encourage the development and dispersal of new wealth throughout the population, thereby fostering the growth of the middle-class (bequeathments of "old money," in contrast, have no similar positive effects, and hence can be taxed away).

Chapter two discusses the views of early liberal writers on inheritance. The positions of John Locke, Adam Smith, Thomas Paine, William Godwin, and John Stuart Mill are outlined and evaluated. Chapter three focuses on Mill's utilitarianism and the Rignano scheme, as formulated primarily in Rignano's The Social Significance of Death Duties. Halliday explains that Rignano was working within Mill's utilitarian framework, and recommends that we repurpose the Rignano scheme for liberal egalitarianism. Liberal egalitarianism is concerned with securing and maintaining the free and equal standing of all citizens over time. This requires preventing or breaking up economic segregation, and the Rignano scheme can help do this.

Halliday develops his egalitarian framework in chapters three, four, and five. Since my main criticism of the book concerns his attempt to integrate elements of luck egalitarianism into a social egalitarian framework, I will save my discussion of these chapters until the next section.

Chapter seven addresses libertarian views. It is not clear to me why this chapter is included in the book. Halliday writes that "there is more to be gained from using libertarian insights to develop the views that I have already defended, rather than being drawn into the broader fight between egalitarians and libertarians" (p. 162). But since libertarianism is incompatible with liberal egalitarianism, including Halliday's version, I cannot see what utility these "insights" might have. I would have welcomed some explanation of how liberal egalitarianism might perhaps revise and appropriate them.

The final chapter is the most "applied" of the book as it considers alternative tax schemes and argues that the Rignano scheme is to be preferred over viable alternatives for addressing the problem of economic segregation. Halliday emphasizes that a just tax scheme must satisfy a (Rawlsian) criterion of publicity, and that alternative schemes must be evaluated against each other rather than against some perfect ideal, with the recognition that any scheme when implemented will be imperfect (pp. 186-88).

I found especially interesting Halliday's comparison of his proposal with Thomas Piketty's endorsement of a wealth tax (pp. 201-204). The two proposals have different targets: Piketty's wealth tax concerns the staggering wealth of a small class of elite rentiers, whereas the Rignano scheme addresses more general economic segregation. Halliday concludes that the two proposals consequently are compatible. This is an interesting claim, I think, and worthy of further consideration.


As mentioned earlier, in chapters three, four, and five, Halliday tries to formulate a version of liberal egalitarianism that integrates luck egalitarianism and social egalitarianism. I think that this integrative endeavour is unsuccessful.

First, some background. Two families of liberal egalitarian conceptions of justice have emerged over the past few decades: luck egalitarianism and social egalitarianism (the latter also is known as "relational egalitarianism"). Both families share a common ancestor: the account of justice presented in Rawls's A Theory of Justice. Luck egalitarians have understood their project, at least in part, as developing the implications of Rawls's comments on the "moral arbitrariness" of the distribution of unchosen social and natural advantages in Theory[3] into a distinct approach to theorizing about justice, one that is egalitarian in nature but also sensitive to individual responsibility. According to luck egalitarians, the aim of justice is to neutralize any disadvantages that people are born into or acquire as the result of brute luck, disadvantages for which they are not responsible and consequently do not deserve. In a fully just luck egalitarian society, people would fare well or poorly solely in conformity to those decisions and actions for which they are rightly responsible.

But despite helping to inspire luck egalitarianism, Rawls's own conception of "justice as fairness" is a form of social egalitarianism. While not all social egalitarians endorse justice as fairness, they generally follow Rawls's "constructivist" approach to thinking about justice.[4] According to this approach, broadly speaking, principles of political justice should be understood as rationally constructed in order to satisfy the requirements of reciprocity among free and equal citizens under conditions of relative scarcity. A fully just social egalitarian society, then, is not one that "neutralizes luck," but rather one in which citizens relate to each other as social equals on the basis of mutual respect, and freely govern their lives on conditions fair to all.

Halliday's view is primarily a social egalitarian one. He explains some of the key problems with luck egalitarianism, especially as applied to questions having to do with inheritance, in chapter four. For instance, because of its single-minded focus on the distinction between "choice" and "circumstance," what Halliday terms "naïve luck egalitarianism" implausibly condemns "all inheritance no matter its size." So naïve luck egalitarianism condemns as unjust the inheritance of "my grandfather's old beer tankard" (pp. 77-78). After dispatching naïve luck egalitarianism, the more nuanced views of theorists such as G.A. Cohen, Kok-Chor Tan, and Ronald Dworkin are discussed and criticized. Ultimately, Halliday holds that luck egalitarianism, by itself, is unsatisfactory because of its focus on whether or not individuals "deserve" their conditions and holdings: the view cannot address the problem of group segregation and inequality, including economic segregation.

Chapters five and six discuss economic segregation and how inheritance helps to maintain it over time. "Economic segregation," Halliday writes, "is a type of social segregation that occurs when groups have their boundaries defined by economic difference rather than by (e.g.) racial or religious difference" (p. 102). Halliday points out that it is not just inequality of wealth that is a cause of social segregation. The intergenerational transfer of wealth facilitates the hoarding of nonfinancial -- social and cultural -- capital. Social capital "consists in valuable knowledge and opportunities," whereas cultural capital "consists in certain behavioural norms or dispositions" (p. 107). According to Halliday,

the significance of inheritance owes much to the way in which intergenerational transfers help groups maintain their accumulated nonfinancial capital, even if nonfinancial capital is not transferred down the generations simply as an automatic consequence of the transfer of wealth. (pp. 107-108)

Those who inherit wealth, or know that they will eventually, can devote considerable resources and time to providing their children with the means for superior life-prospects. Valuable cultural capital can be transferred through the cultivation of "prestigious" hobbies and skills (violin-playing or fluency in a foreign language), as well as education and more general patterns of behaviour (accents, confidence when interacting with authorities, and so forth). Social capital is secured via access to elite schools, internships, job opportunities, and the like. These forms of nonfinancial capital reinforce each other: those who possess cultural capital can exploit effectively their social capital. Moreover, these advantages reinforce themselves over generations: parents who already possess cultural and social capital can transfer it to their children more readily than those who do not. The discussion of these processes in chapters five and six -- and the difficulty, if not practical impossibility, of overcoming them without wealth redistribution, including restrictions on inheritances -- is insightful and important.

Halliday notes that social egalitarianism is committed to two core claims about justice, one "negative" and one "positive." The negative claim is that "equality requires the elimination of oppressive social hierarchies." The positive claim is that justice requires that social institutions be reformed or designed "so as to create a genuine society of equals" (p. 105). Inheritance flows facilitate economic segregation, and economic segregation is a social hierarchy that thwarts the creation of a society of substantively free and equal citizens. Consequently, the social egalitarian case for regulating inheritance, whether via the Rignano scheme or some other form of taxation, is straightforward. Citizens cannot relate to one another as equals if they live in a de facto aristocracy, that is, a society that (to a great extent) allocates economic opportunities and political power based upon citizens' unchosen classes.

The social egalitarian view looks sufficient to justify the regulation of intergenerational flows of wealth. Yet Halliday contends that luck egalitarianism also has a role to play: "luck cannot be eliminated from an egalitarian diagnosis of what is objectionable about unrestricted inheritance," he writes, "Inheritance is unjust when it allows some people to enjoy brute luck advantage, but the specific kind of brute luck advantage is understood in terms of group membership" (p. 152). So, while social egalitarianism helps explain why economic segregation is unjust and measures should be taken to eliminate or reduce it as much as possible, including regulating inheritances, it needs to be supplemented with the claim that it is unjust that some people enjoy superior or inferior life prospects simply in virtue of having been born into one economic class or another.

I think that this attempt to integrate luck egalitarianism and social egalitarianism misconstrues the nature of social egalitarianism's objection to social segregation. Social egalitarians are aware that it is a matter of "luck" that, for instance, some people need wheelchairs to get around adequately and others do not. But this is not why justice requires the adequate provision of wheelchairs to all citizens who need them, and that public and commercial spaces must accommodate them. Such accommodation simply is necessary for equal citizenship -- "correcting" for brute bad luck has nothing to do with it.

When someone is born into a family in which there is considerable inherited wealth -- in which one's parents themselves inherited or will inherit wealth, and thus can secure competitive advantages with respect to social and cultural capital for the person in question -- this is indeed a matter of "luck," insofar as that person did nothing to "deserve" that place within the social hierarchy. Likewise, someone born white and male in a racist and patriarchal society did nothing to "deserve" that privileged position. But it is not the luck in such cases that is the problem; rather it is the hierarchy. Social egalitarians aim at the elimination of economically segregated hierarchies altogether, whatever their source, because hierarchies prevent egalitarian social relations -- just as they aim at the elimination of race- or sex-based hierarchies. Consequently, I do not think that social egalitarianism "needs" to embed any luck egalitarian component into its framework -- "anti-luckism" simply is not a concern of social egalitarianism. (Being born poor, non-white, and/or female are not "misfortunes" for which one should be "compensated.")

The Rawlsian version of social egalitarianism, for instance, holds that social equality involves ensuring that the principles of justice that are to regulate the most important social institutions of society, its "basic structure," enable citizens to live and interact as both equal subjects and co-sovereigns. Hence those principles must satisfy what Rawls calls the "criterion of reciprocity." According to Halliday, "reciprocity is not the only concept that Rawls used to derive the requirements of justice and . . . he did not actually invoke the concept of reciprocity when alluding to why justice might require restrictions on inherited wealth" (p. 90). This is a misinterpretation, though, as it fails to recognize the foundational role of reciprocity in Rawls's theory. The criterion of reciprocity is the "intrinsic (moral) political ideal" of justice as fairness[5] -- indeed, it justifies the use of the "original position" device to formulate the principles of justice as fairness.[6] Consequently, reciprocity does justify Rawls's overall conception of justice and the restrictions on inherited wealth that he thinks are required by that conception. Justice as fairness is the most reasonable conception of justice because it best satisfies the requirements of reciprocity.[7]

Once we see that social egalitarianism (at least of the Rawlsian variety) is committed to reciprocity, and economic segregation violates the requirements of reciprocity (as expressed in the principles of justice), then the case for regulating the intergenerational transfer of wealth is straightforward -- as Rawls's own brief recommendations indicate. There is no need to appeal to any form of luck egalitarianism. Moreover, the social egalitarian case is not only sufficient, but its "second personal" constructivist character, focused on reciprocity, cannot felicitously be merged with the assumptions of luck egalitarianism.[8]


My comments have focused primarily on the aspect of Halliday's view with which I disagree. Nonetheless, I think that the analyses and arguments presented in this book are interesting and important. I learned a lot from reading it. Halliday certainly is correct that justice requires the regulation of inheritances, and the Rignano scheme is an intriguing proposal for how to do so. Hence, I strongly recommend this book to anyone interested in contemporary issues concerning distributive justice.


[1] See J. Rawls (1999), A Theory of Justice, revised edition (Harvard University Press), pp. 245-246; (2001) Justice as Fairness: A Restatement (Harvard University Press), pp. 160-161.

[2] See, e.g., T. Piketty (2014) Capital in the Twenty-First Century (Harvard University Press).

[3] See Rawls (1999), pp. 63-65, 87-89, 274.

[4] Some social egalitarians, like Elizabeth Anderson, refer to "contractualism" rather than "constructivism" (see E. Anderson (2010) "The Fundamental Disagreement between Luck Egalitarians and Relational Egalitarians," Canadian Journal of Philosophy (Supplementary Volume 36): 1-23). Everything that I say about constructivism can be restated in contractualist terms.

[5] Rawls 2005, p. xlv.

[6] See Rawls 2005, pp. xlviii-xlix, 450.

[7] See Rawls 2005, pp. xlvi-xlvii.

[8] See Anderson (2010).