The Injustice of Punishment

Placeholder book cover

Bruce N. Waller, The Injustice of Punishment, Routledge, 2018, 252pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138506398.

Reviewed by Saul Smilansky, University of Haifa


In recent years, Bruce Waller has published a number of interrelated books that forcefully argue for abandoning the widespread belief in moral responsibility, exploring the radical implications, which he views optimistically. Like all of his books, this one is philosophically up to date, admirably engages with a very broad range of literature outside philosophy, and expresses Waller's deeply caring attitude about human beings and vehement drive to correct social evils.

Readers familiar with Waller's work will find familiar themes here: the acceptance of free will together with the rejection of free will-based moral responsibility, the evils of the moral responsibility system, and a detailed error theory-like attempt to explain why belief in moral responsibility persists despite his claim that it is baseless. For those who have not read his previous books, this one, despite its specific focus, can provide a fine summary of his work.

Punishment is a good topic for moral responsibility denialists because it is an area where unnecessary evils are easy to show. Particularly in the US, which is Waller's almost exclusive focus, there is clearly much public retributivism gone wild, over-criminalization, over-punishment and, simply, cruelty. In other areas, denialists on free will (in the moral responsibility sense), moral responsibility, desert and the related notions have a difficult task in making life without these moral and psychological staples seem palatable. It is difficult to reject the dependency of forms of self-respect and respect for persons, or the appreciation of the efforts and sacrifices of others, on the ideas of free choice and moral responsibility. If everything that we and those we care about do is merely an "unfolding of the given", ultimately beyond our control, then fundamental aspects of humanity such as those concerning the attaining of value, gratitude and appreciation-based love are under grave threat. If not altogether senseless, they become much impoverished. It is hence questionable whether we can live without notions of free will and moral responsibility in daily life, and should want to try. Contemporary practices of retributive punishment, on the other hand, can more easily seem antiquated, unnecessarily vindictive, brutal and primitive.

The topic of punishment is also crucial for moral responsibility denialists. The paradigm of our thinking about the free will problem sees individual control as the basis for moral responsibility which is, in turn, the basis for the treatments and reactions we deserve for our good or bad actions. That is why punishment of the innocent, of the very young, or collective punishment, for example, are a moral anathema. So what do the denialists have to offer instead? Can they maintain the old Blackstonian moral idea that it is better that ten guilty persons escape than that one innocent party suffer? But how, when, after all, for denialists everyone is morally innocent, whether she has done anything bad or not? More broadly, can denialists resist the constant temptations for the efficient management of people; can they respect other values that have been conceptually and historically dependent on the idea of moral responsibility, and avoid joining the utilitarians on punishment?

Waller has interesting and original things to say on punishment. He is admirably clear and open that even if denialist prescriptions are followed, much punishment will remain -- but most important, that it will be unjust. While some hard determinists and other free will denialists such as Derk Pereboom and Derek Parfit have wanted to "save" the idea that even for denialists punishment can be just, Waller looks at the unfairness head on, and admits that it is a lost case. Just punishment requires desert, but desert is impossible: "all punishment is unjust; no one ever under any circumstances justly deserves punishment" (p.1).

Waller's main proposal is a no-blame system model that originates in the workplace.

Rather than blaming or shaming an individual worker as the source of the problem, the system model treats errors and mistakes -- whether large or small -- as learning opportunities that can improve the workplace and the production system. A worker who reports an error . . . is thanked rather than blamed. (pp.163-4)

The emphasis on individual fault and blaming for it is transformed into a constructive, open search for the causes of failure beyond individuals, to which the individuals are encouraged to contribute.

I liked Waller's critical discussion of the therapeutic would-be alternative to the moral responsibility model. He rightly recognizes the dangers of abuse and inherent risks of the over-concentration of state and other forms of power over individuals, although he is too reluctant to acknowledge the civilizing effect and the safeguards that belief in moral responsibility has provided here. The discussion of restorative justice is particularly interesting. This has become a fashionable would-be alternative to the more traditional views of punishment. Waller seems right to point out that this approach as well poses a serious risk to self-respect, and is in constant danger of degenerating into shaming and victimization. These are just some examples of the richness and interest of the book.

The book has to my mind three serious drawbacks. The first is external: Waller's denialist rejection of any possibility for moral responsibility or blame seems to me "ideologically" dogmatic, even more so since he accepts the idea of free will. It is difficult to accept that no sense could be made of these paradigmatic notions. Consider an example. In a certain workplace parking is difficult to find, particularly close to the main building. The senior management has some parking places reserved individually, but the rest have to struggle for a place every morning. A few parking places near the entrance have been reserved for disabled drivers, and they are in constant use. However, one of the junior managers, who is not entitled to a place of his own, regularly parks in the spaces reserved for the disabled. As a result, it often happens that a disabled driver cannot find a parking place in the vicinity of the building, and he or she has to struggle to get from a distant parking space to the entrance.

I trust that we can all agree that the arrangement whereby some parking places near the entrance are reserved for the disabled is fair and reasonable, and that there is no justification for the behavior of the junior manager. The question is whether we can view him as morally responsible, blame, and threaten to punish him. We assume that he is an adult who does not suffer from any of the dramatic mental difficulties that excuse responsibility even for compatibilists. He can, for example, perfectly well understand the situation, is responsive to reasons, is not a psychopath, and has no particular compulsion for illicit parking spaces. It is merely that parking near the entrance is a large benefit, which he happily helps himself to when he can, if he can get away with it. I see no good reason to put the bar of moral responsibility so artificially high that people (like our illicit parker) can never be seen as sufficiently morally responsible, blameworthy and justly punishable. If we join him and a disabled person who confronts him in a conversation about the parking space, I find it hard to see how he can defend himself. Determinism (or absence of libertarian free will irrespective of determinism) seems irrelevant, at the time of the challenge. "I cannot help parking here", he will say, "that is the sort of person I am. Haven't you heard about determinism?" "But what's stopping you? Why won't you do the right thing, move your car and let me park here?" asks the disabled employee. It is hard to see anything that the illicit parker can say that will seem minimally convincing. Matters are up to him at the present time, and he cannot disown his agency or refuse the moral responsibility -- and the blame due to him if he persists. Everything he says appears as sheer hypocrisy.

If the junior manager continues to park in the disabled places, his behavior is shameful, and inexcusable. He might benefit by having this pointed out to him, and hopefully will begin to feel guilty when parking, and become a better person. In any case, he should stop behaving as he does and, if he does not, can be properly blamed and, if need be, punished. If, after proper and repeated warning, he is heavily fined, or his name is made public, then that seems an acceptable punishment. It is not unjust to do so in order to get him to stop parking in the disabled spaces; and arguably even irrespective of future consequences, so that he does not end up gaining through his conscious, willful, persistent, inconsiderate wrongdoing. Now if, say, the people responsible for enforcing the parking rights of the disabled do not punish the illicit parker because he bribes them and there is no one to turn to for help, then I think that it would be perfectly just of some disabled persons to come together, publically morally condemn and shame the parker, and, if nothing helps, even punish him in some moderate way (say, take the air out of his tires or scratch his car). Waller's absolute rejection of compatibilist moral responsibility, blame, and punishment is no better than the absolutists on the other side, who do not recognize how often blame and punishment can be unjust. We need a more nuanced account that recognizes the psychological, social and moral complexities.

A second drawback of Waller's position is that, as far as I can see, his non-blame systems approach does not come close to addressing the predicament of punishment. I have learned much from his discussion, and there are good reasons to recognize the advantages of this approach to management in areas as diverse as airline controllers, vehicle construction, and perhaps even some spheres of medical practice. More broad attempts at their social application would be welcome. But when it functions well, the non-blame culture by and large works on the assumption that the persons involved are people of good will, eager to work together for the common purposes. That seems to assume away any realistic assessment of most serious criminals. It is not an accident that the no-blame approach typically deals with (at worse) negligence, rather than outright malevolence and intentional destruction. Moreover, any psychological description of the good members of such communities seems to me to take for granted that they do hold themselves responsible, and would blame themselves were they not to meet their own or the group's standards. The no-blame culture seems a welcome, if limited, addition to the way in which moral responsibility-accepting persons will engage with themselves and others.

A third drawback of the book is that it remains too parochial, and does not seriously take up the intriguing approaches to punishment of certain Western European countries. Waller notes in passing some such options, particularly the Norwegian one, but he does not engage with them in depth. This is regrettable, since for free will denialists this seems the most promising path concerning punishment.

Skeptics about optimistic-denialism-on-moral-responsibility, like myself, will doubt whether those options are really viable for non-homogeneous societies with a huge, professional and violent criminal population, such as the US. They will also doubt whether in fact the success of those few European models does not depend on cultural traditions of restraint and the internalization of moral responsibility, that the rehabilitation processes build on and further develop, rather than rejecting moral responsibility as Waller proposes. But here there is much that is still unclear, and that moral responsibility denialists would do well to focus on. Since such actual alternative models of punishment are not deeply explored, once Waller's enthusiasm for the no-blame corporate approach is seen as much too great, little is left except the idea that we have to punish, and should aim to do so as little as possible.

Despite these drawbacks, The Injustice of Punishment is an important, original, and thoughtful contribution to the assessment of punishment, and in particular to the question of whether we would be better off here without the belief in moral responsibility.