The Inner Word in Gadamer's Hermeneutics

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John Arthos, The Inner Word in Gadamer's Hermeneutics, U of Notre Dame Press, 2009, 460pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268020347.

Reviewed by David Vessey, Grand Valley State University



Gadamer refused to separate doing philosophy from doing the history of philosophy. To philosophize well, he argued, you had to become conscious of the role tradition plays in shaping your concepts and your conclusions. To do the history of philosophy well you have to philosophize well, for to understand a philosopher’s views you need to discern what questions his or her views are answering, and that means understanding what questions are good philosophical questions to ask and what would count as good philosophical answers to those questions. Consequently, Gadamer’s philosophizing is done in constant dialogue with philosophers of the past and often lying behind even brief references are unarticulated intellectual richness. Readers of Gadamer are just now starting to appreciate all that is in play in his readings of the history of philosophy. John Arthos’ 400-page book — essentially on nine pages of Truth and Method — will be a model for future scholarship on Gadamer’s intellectual inheritance.

In the section “Language and Verbum” in the third part of Truth and Method Gadamer makes the remarkable claim that “the human relationship between thought and speech corresponds, despite its imperfections, to the divine relationship of the Trinity.”1 He inststs that a proper understanding of how language connects to the world can only come through reflecting on Augustine’s doctrine of the Verbum interius. Arthos not only presents Augustine’s doctrine (in Chapter Three, “Hermeneutic Anticipations: The Circular Ontology of the Word in Augustine”) he explores in great detail the historical, philosophical, and theological background to Augustine’s views. His first chapter, “The Graeco-Roman and Judaeo-Christian Word” presents the origins of the Logos doctrine in Hebrew scripture; in ancient, pre-Attic, Greek; in Hellenistic Greek and Judaism (Philo); in Neo-Platonism; and, leaping ahead in time, in early Protestant theology. His second chapter, “Immanence and Transcendence in the Trinity”, covers the developments of Patristic Christology and Trinitarian theology. Chapters 4-6 look more closely at the Thomistic (Chapter Four, “‘The Word Is Not Reflexive’: Mind and World in Aquinas and Gadamer”), Hegelian (Chapter Five, “The Pattern of Hegel’s Trinity: The Legacy of Christian Immanence in German Thought”) and Heideggerian (Chapter Six, “Heidegger: On the Way to the Verbum”) influences on Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics. As you can tell from his widely cast net, Arthos provides a general overview of Gadamer’s thought. His presentation is distinctive not only for how it emphasizes medieval theological influences on Gadamer’s philosophy of language, but also for how it highlights Gadamer’s debts to humanism and to the history of rhetoric.

In the second part of his book, Arthos provides a new translation of, and an extraordinarily detailed and insightful commentary on, the “Language and Verbum” section from Truth and Method. In that section Gadamer claims that

there is an idea that is not Greek that does more justice to the being of language, and so prevented the forgetfulness of language in Western thought from being complete. This is the idea of Christian incarnation.2

The “forgetfulness of language” is the view that since Plato (according to Gadamer) language is understood as standing in a merely semiotic, instrumental relationship to things. Words are signs, they typically have a different kind of being than the things they signify, and we relate to them as tools of use for thought and communication. Gadamer disagrees with this view and argues over the course of the final third of Truth and Method that there is a fundamentally ontological connection between words and things and that language is not first and foremost a tool for our use, but the medium through which the world is disclosed to consciousness. Gadamer holds that we are able to escape the “forgetfulness of language” only because we’ve inherited the conceptual resources generated by medieval interpretations of the Trinity. He is quick to point out that he is not interested in the theological implications of Trinitarian thought; still, we owe a great debt to Arthos for working out in detail how something that is literally a theological mystery can provide substantive conceptual resources for solving a philosophical problem absolutely central to Gadamer’s hermeneutics. Indeed because it sheds light on Gadamer’s theory of language, and language is so fundamental to his hermeneutics, through addressing this topic Arthos provides a coherent, systematic overview of Gadamer’s philosophy. Although his focus is the small section of Truth and Method, he draws widely from Gadamer’s Gesammelte Werke.

What is it that Gadamer finds in Augustine and the account of the Verbum that Greek accounts of language lack and that can give us clues to an account of language where words are not merely tools at our disposal for picking out things, but are ontologically connected to things? It’s the idea that the Word, as the second person of the Trinity, progresses from the Father (as Son) and becomes incarnate, but in a way that takes nothing away from God the Father. This idea of something coming to be in language (the analogy of becoming incarnate as Word) without diminishing the being of the thing is how Gadamer will start to see the relation between language and things. Bringing some thing into language is not a diminishment of the being of the thing, but a kind of realization of it. As Gadamer puts it: “In the end, the true being of things becomes accessible precisely in their linguistic appearance”3. Adding to the ontological preservation in the incarnation is Augustine’s Trinitarian philosophy of mind. The inner Word, for Augustine, is embodied, albeit imperfectly, in the expressed word in a particular language. The relation between idea and thought and speech is linguistic, at least to some degree, and so the full connection between thought, speech and the objects of thought and speech is made possible because of language. Here Gadamer is drawing on the medieval sources in order to shape his hermeneutic criticism of Husserl’s phenomenology; not only is our relationship to the world interpretive, intentionality, the fundamental principle of phenomenology, is an accomplishment of language. It is on this basis that Gadamer claims that "the universality [of hermeneutics] consists in inner speech… . This I learned from Augustine’s De Trinitatae."4

I have two serious concerns about Gadamer’s appeal to Augustine’s account of the Verbum to solve the problem of “the forgetfulness of language”. These concerns are not concerns about Arthos’s book except that, to the extent he has focused on bringing out the richness of Gadamer’s references, he has not been critical enough of Gadamer’s project. First, Gadamer’s holds that were it not for Augustine’s account of the Verbum interius we would have descended into an inescapable forgetfulness of language. It’s hard to know what would count as evidence for this claim. That Augustine’s view is distinctively non-Greek, in the sense that it is impossible to express it in the range of traditional categories of Greek metaphysics, does not mean that without it later thinkers could not have thought in non-Greek ways. Moreover Gadamer is seeking a purely secular understanding of the ontological connection between words and things, so the theological context of the Trinity would not seem to be historically essential for avoiding a merely semiotic interpretation of language. I think a more plausible way of putting Gadamer’s conclusion should be that Augustine, and especially Aquinas, developed aspects of their philosophies of language and mind that were indebted to their Christologies and that help us today to explain the proper ontological relation between words and things. The more extreme, quasi-Heideggarian claim about the forgetfulness of language is best ignored.

Second, although Gadamer and Arthos focus on Augustine’s account of the Verbum, it seems to violate many of the basic principles of Gadamer’s hermeneutics. For one thing, the inner word in Augustine, as Gadamer notes, is non-linguistic. Arthos makes a fantastic case for why the proper translation of logos is verbum, as opposed to ratio, but its universality lies in the fact that it transcends all particular manifestations of it in any actual language. Moreover Gadamer’s goal is to draw an ontological, non-semiotic relation between words and things, yet for Augustine the relation between an external word and the inner word, much less the thing meant, can only be representational. Sounds are signs for thoughts and things. In fact if Philip Cary is right in his book Outward Signs, Augustine is the first to provide a thoroughly semiotic theory of language. In general, it’s very difficult to see how the Neo-Platonic Augustine is going to provide the resources Gadamer needs for escaping a Platonic problem of language. More resources might be found in Aquinas’ Aristotelian account of the Verbum, and in those important nine pages of Truth and Method Gadamer speaks more about Aquinas than Augustine, but for Gadamer and Arthos, Augustine remains the main figure. Regardless of our reservations about Gadamer’s reading of the history of philosophy, we can understand and evaluate Gadamer’s theory of language as the vehicle for how our mind connects to the world independently of his quasi-Heideggerian claims about the forgetfulness of language and his appeal to Augustine as having the redeeming understanding of language.

My one quibble with Arthos is with his discussion of Heidegger. Before his translation and exegesis of the crucial sections of Gadamer’s Truth and Method, Arthos devotes one chapter to the importance of the trinity for Hegel’s thought and one chapter to Heidegger’s philosophy of language. He argues that “the meaning-structure Heidegger saw in the logos is similar to what Augustine and Aquinas saw as the structure of reflection” (214) and concludes the chapter:

Gadamer’s exploration of the medieval sources of hermeneutics marks in more than one way his debt and his distance from his mentor. In taking over what Heidegger had taught him about the Pre-Socratic logos, Gadamer will explore his ties to the scholastic verbum that Heidegger had eschewed in a return to the ‘beginning.’ (215)

He admirably and convincingly shows that

when Gadamer said that the truth of the universality of hermeneutic understanding lies in the verbum interius, he meant that Heidegger’s speculations on language and being sprang from the fertile ground that had been cultivated in the Christian encounter with logos. (66)

But the “distance from his mentor” is not fully or adequately brought forth. I would like to stress that although Arthos finds much continuity between Gadamer and Heidegger, his discussion also hits upon one of the crucial ways in which Gadamer differs from Heidegger, and in which Gadamer sees himself as correcting Heidegger. For Gadamer, the connection between word and thing is also the connection between thought and thing. Thinking and finding the right word converge and their success lies in bringing the object to shared consciousness especially in dialogue. This is notably different from Heidegger’s account of thinking, especially in those texts from Gelassenheit from which Arthos quotes extensively. These differences between Heidegger and Gadamer all resonate in Gadamer’s recovery of medieval interpretations of the logos rather than, as Heidegger would prefer, recovering the meaning of the logos in Heraclitus’s writings.

This quibble should not distract from the impressiveness of Arthos’ book. Drawing widely from Gadamer’s writings while focusing on one crucial move in Gadamer’s argument, it provides both a systemic interpretation of Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics and an informative overview of those views — ancient, medieval and modern — that helped shape crucial aspects of Gadamer’s thought. The Inner Word in Gadamer’s Hermeneutics is a massively learned text that shows how much thought is going on behind the scenes in Gadamer own massively learned Truth and Method.

1 Truth and Method (New York: Continuum 421).

2 Truth and Method, 418.

3 “The Language of Things and the Nature of Things” in Philosophical Hermeneutics (Berkeley: U of California Press, 1976), 75-76.

4 Quoted in Jean Grondin’s Introduction to Philosophical Hermeneutics (New Haven: Yale UP, 1994), xiv.