The Instrument of Science: Scientific Anti-Realism Revitalized

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Darrell P. Rowbottom, The Instrument of Science: Scientific Anti-Realism Revitalized, Routledge, 2019, 215pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367077457.

Reviewed by K. Brad Wray, Aarhus University


Darrell Rowbottom has published extensively on the realism/antirealism debate, and his book is the culmination of that work. In it, he aims to bring back to life instrumentalism, a view that is associated with Ernst Mach and William James, among others. Instrumentalism, though, has not played a significant role in the recent realism/anti-realism debates, since the 1970s or so. Rowbottom aims to show why instrumentalism is the most appropriate position to adopt towards scientific theories. He also aims to address some criticisms of instrumentalism.

As an anti-realist, I especially welcome an ally in the battle against the realists. Anti-realists stand to gain some ground by standing together, advancing novel arguments against our common foes. Indeed, I think it is a good sign for the anti-realists that the realist position is fragmenting. There are now so many varieties of realism: convergent realism, structural realism, property realism, entity realism, selective realism, etc. The moment for action is now, while their camp is in disarray!

The book has seven chapters and an appendix. The first three chapters present the case for instrumentalism. The fourth chapter, provides an extended historical case study, focusing on physics between 1885 and 1930. The final three chapters address criticism. And the Appendix aims to explain what scientific realism is.

The first three chapters are the strongest part of the book. Here, Rowbottom's arguments are tight, and he proceeds cautiously, with the result that the scope of his conclusions is generally proportioned to the strength of his arguments and evidence. His careful and detailed discussion of the pendulum as "a case study on accuracy, simplicity, and scope," is especially noteworthy. Through an analysis of "the equation for the restorative force of the bob [of a pendulum]," that is, F = - mg sin θ, he shows us how idealizations are responsible for both the predictive power of a theory or model and our understanding of pendulums (8). Step by step, by introducing more and more factors that could be accounted for, Rowbottom shows how one could present a more truth-like equation that takes account of many features that are merely glossed over by the simple equation. But, as he notes, pursuing such a strategy, scientists often sacrifice predictive power and understanding. Many people have discussed idealization and its implications, but Rowbottom's patient presentation makes this discussion far more concrete. By the end of his analysis, with 18 numbered equations, we can understand why rational scientists will often be satisfied with idealizations, not because they are "good enough", but rather because they are better than the alternatives, even granting the alternatives are closer to the truth.

In Chapter 3 Rowbottom presents an argument that is an important extension of Kyle Stanford's famous Argument from Unconceived Alternatives (see Stanford 2006). Stanford rightly notes that often in the history of science, scientists consider only a very limited number of theories when they are choosing what theory to accept. From the history of science we have also learned that there are probably other alternative theories, yet unconceived, that can account for the data just as well. This line of argument aims to undermine our confidence in, and, more importantly, our warrant for, the theories we currently accept. As Stanford notes, if Aristotle had known about Newton's theory, clearly even he would have accepted it. Rowbottom rightly points out that the notion of an unconceived alternative can be generalized. In addition to unconceived theories, there are likely to be unconceived observations (Chapter 3, § 2), unconceived models and predictions (Chapter 3, § 3), unconceived explanations (Chapter 3, § 4), unconceived experiments, methods, and instruments (Chapter 3, § 5), and unconceived theoretical values (Chapter 3, § 6). If Stanford's argument is a threat to realism, this array of related arguments should really raise doubts for the realist. Drawing an inference from the success of a theory to its truth with respect to what it says about unobservables is really risky business.

Interestingly, much of this part of the book has no deep connection with instrumentalism. That is, though these sorts of arguments pose a threat to realism, it is not clear they speak in favour of instrumentalism rather than some other kind of anti-realism. But as an anti-realist, that is no problem for me. It is a problem for Rowbottom, who ultimately wants to defend instrumentalism. More on this later.

Chapter 4 is a bit odd and I question how much it contributes to Rowbottom's argument. It purports to provide "historical illuminations" drawn from the history of physics between 1885 and 1930. There is a general concern and a specific concern I want to raise. Let us consider the specific concern first. There is a detailed discussion running from pages 93 to 97, with numbered equations (1) to (22), the details of which I need not go into. The argumentative relevance of the example gets lost in the details. Indeed, it is questionable whether there is anything more here, in this example, than the earlier example, from Chapter 1, about the pendulum. Now consider the general concern. It pertains to the use of the history of science in philosophy of science. At best, the whole of Chapter 4 can provide suggestive support for the various claims that Rowbottom has made in the earlier chapters. But historical case studies, as we have long known, are incredibly malleable. As a consequence, I am quite confident that a realist, Anjan Chakravartty or Stathis Psillos, for example, could look at the same episode and construct a narrative that supports their favourite philosophical theses about science. I do not think historical case studies provide much evidence for philosophical claims of the sort Rowbottom wants to make. Indeed, my assessment of this is related to my anti-realism, specifically, my scepticism about the evidential import of explanation in general. I grant that the history of science should be an important constraint on our theorizing about science. Indeed, that is what I take Stanford to be illustrating in his now-famous argument. But case studies of the sort that Rowbottom presents seem fit to merely illustrate some point, to make it cognitively accessible to a broader audience.

I want to briefly discuss one chapter in the latter part of the book, Chapter 7, on the "Illusion of Scientific Realism". Here Rowbottom draws on some psychological studies about how bad people are at causal reasoning. The studies are interesting and they do lend some support to Rowbotttom's attack on realism. But the research subjects, for the most part, were Yale undergraduates, and the various studies were conducted by one research group. Realists are going to go after Rowbottom about this. And, again, there is nothing specific about these studies that supports instrumentalism rather than some other form of anti-realism.

The Appendix is an odd addition. It purports to take on a very important issue, explaining what scientific realism is. If such a chapter is needed, if it is worth having a 20-page discussion of what realism is, it is probably worth having it early on, so we understand who exactly the target is. I am still unsure whether Rowbottom needed to do this at all, especially given that realism, as noted above, has fragmented into many different positions. And the Appendix does not really give a definitive statement of scientific realism. After reading the Appendix, I got the eerie feeling that it was included as a compromise reached between Rowbottom, the editor he was working with, and some stubborn referee. I think it would have been better left out of the book.

The final concern I would like to raise is that the exact commitments of instrumentalism are still a bit murky. Rowbottom does identify "three core components" of his "cognitive instrumentalism" on the first page:

[1] the value of science lies mainly in . . . what it enables us to understand about and do with observable things; [2] scientific discourse may only be understood literally when it is grounded in talk about observable things; and [3] science may reliably progress . . . without discovering new truths . . . about unobservable things. (1, numerals added)

It is still difficult to get a sense of what instrumentalism entails that other related positions do not. Even Karl Popper recognized that realists, too, believe that theories are instrumentally valuable. So instrumentalism must be more than that.

In summary, I think the book is a welcome and timely addition to the literature. It will certainly help the anti-realist cause, as it provides a number of serious challenges to realism. In that sense it delivers on the claim of the book's sub-title: Scientific Anti-Realism Revitalised. It will also be a valuable starting point for others interested in developing a new instrumentalism in philosophy of science. But, for now, I will remain in the Constructive Empiricist camp.


Stanford, P. Kyle. 2006. Exceeding our Grasp: Science, History, and the Problem of Unconceived Alternatives. Oxford: Oxford University Press.