The Intercorporeal Self: Merleau-Ponty on Subjectivity

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Scott L. Marratto, The Intercorporeal Self: Merleau-Ponty on Subjectivity, SUNY Press, 2013, 254pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438442327.

Reviewed by Thomas Baldwin, University of York


As Marratto's subtitle indicates, he aims to develop an interpretation and defence of Merleau-Ponty's conception of subjectivity, drawing mainly on Phenomenology of Perception (PhP). His main title alludes to Merleau-Ponty's conception of 'intercorporeity', introduced in his 1959 essay on Husserl 'The Philosophy and His Shadow' (reprinted in Signs) to describe the way in which, when two people shake hands, they are 'like organs of one single intercorporeity' (Signs, 168). I will explain at the end how Marratto uses this concept to underpin Merleau-Ponty's early account of subjectivity, but the passage around which Marratto in fact builds his interpretation, and to which he returns throughout the book, comes at the end of the first chapter of Part II of PhP where Merleau-Ponty writes:

It is in the experience of the thing that the reflective ideal of thetic thought will be founded. Reflection will itself grasp its full sense only if it refers to the unreflective ground (le fonds irréfléchi) it presupposes, from which it profits, and which constitutes for it, like an original past, a past which has never been present. (PhP 280: CS 242, DL 252; translation modified).

It is the conception here of 'the unreflective ground' which is 'a past which has never been present' that Marratto makes central to his interpretation. Before moving on, however, a few words about translation and textual reference are needed. Marratto uses Colin Smith's translation of PhP (with some modifications), with page numbers from the original 1962 edition. So users of the new translation of PhP by Donald Landes (Routledge, 2012) will find it difficult to locate the passages Marratto refers to. It might be thought that there is an easy way of dealing with this, since Marratto also gives references to Merleau-Ponty's French text. But although Landes's translation includes marginal references to the French text, they are to the modified 2005 edition, and not to the original 1945 edition which Marratto uses and which has different page numbers. The result is, unfortunately, that readers of Marratto's book will need to have access to the 1945 Gallimard edition of Phénoménologie de la Perception and/or the 1962 edition of Smith's translation of it.

Another reason I mention this point is that Marratto sometimes relies on Smith's translation where the translation itself is questionable: for example in the passage cited above Smith translated the key phrase 'le fonds irréfléchi' as 'the unreflective fund of experience', and it is as such that Marratto then discusses its interpretation, without omitting Smith's gratuitous addition of the phrase 'of experience' which is not in Merleau-Ponty's text at all (Landes corrects this point, but translates 'irréfléchi' as 'prereflective', which is a mistake). In this review I will follow Marratto by using the page numbers of the 1945 edition of Merleau-Ponty's text and the 1962 edition of Colin Smith's translation; but I will add page references to the Donald Landes translation, prefixing references to the translations with the initials of the translators, as in the references for the passage cited above. In many cases my translations differ slightly from those of Smith and Landes.

Marratto sets his interpretation of Merleau-Ponty in the context of two debates, one concerning the project of developing a 'naturalised phenomenology', the other the merits of a Derrida-inspired critique of Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology as another instance of 'the metaphysics of presence'. Merleau-Ponty's position on the first of these issues is clear: he maintained that 'perception is not an event of nature' (The Structure of Behavior, 145), and Marratto argues that once his account of perception is understood properly, it will indeed be seen that his phenomenology cannot be fully naturalised. Marratto then uses this account of perception to argue that Merleau-Ponty's account of subjectivity is such that he is not guilty of the metaphysics of presence.

In discussing the first issue, Maratto takes J. J. Gibson's ecological account of vision and the sensorimotor account of perception developed by Alva Noë and Kevin O'Regan as good candidates for positions which can accommodate the core of Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of perception and are also naturalistic, in that they draw only on the methods and resources of the natural sciences. Marratto then argues that neither of these accounts can in fact do justice to the role which Merleau-Ponty assigns to 'situated subjectivity' in perception. This 'situated subjectivity' is nothing to do with subjective 'qualia'; Merleau-Ponty is as emphatic a critic of this conception as anyone. Nor is it the simple thought that because naturalistic accounts of vision are fundamentally third-person they cannot do justice to the first-person spatial perspective inherent in perception; for, as Marratto acknowledges, there is no inherent difficulty in accommodating a first-person spatial perspective within a third-person framework.

Nonetheless there is a more complex thought of this kind which, Marratto holds, cannot be accommodated: 'The field of awareness, with its prominences and occlusions, its nearness and farness, its surfaces and levels, is not structured by third-person processes -- rather, it must be understood as the meaningful situation of a being who moves, values, acts, and responds' (Marratto: 99). What is important here is the way in which the subject's 'values' are held to motivate and give meaningful structure to the perceived world. It is this 'subjective' contribution which, Marratto holds, is not dealt with adequately by either Noë and O'Regan or by Gibson and which cannot be properly accommodated in a naturalistic account of perception.

In order to understand the issues here, it is, I think, useful to bear in mind the old nature/culture debate in which Rickert, Weber and others argued that the historical development of cultural practices cannot be sensibly understood by applying the methods of the natural sciences because the idiosyncratic role of ideas, meanings and values in cultural practices implies that their development cannot be understood by reference to general laws of the kind which are characteristic of the natural sciences. If this position is correct (as I think it is), then it implies that there is here a limit to naturalism, where this is understood by reference to the characteristic methods of the natural sciences, though it remains to be clarified just how the differences here are identified and elucidated (language obviously plays an important role). One may well also wish to allow for John McDowell's 'naturalism of second nature' (Mind and World, 86), which proposes that there is a legitimate conception of human nature according to which the development of cultural practices ('second nature') is 'natural'.

Returning now to Marratto's discussion of perception, his argument can be viewed as resting on the thesis that perception, even its most basic structural forms such as 'the field of awareness, with its prominences and occlusions, its nearness and farness, its surfaces and levels', counts as cultural in an extended sense, and for this reason lies beyond the limits of naturalism. But whether this extension is plausible seems to me questionable; for one can argue, on the contrary, that there are powerful evolutionary reasons for supposing that the basic structural forms of perception have become hard-wired into human perceptual systems in the ways that Gibson's theory assumes and which is confirmed by studies of child psychology and by the almost universal recognition of the Gestalt phenomena to which Merleau-Ponty frequently alludes.

There is manifestly more to be said on this issue, but it is now time to turn to Marratto's account of the central themes of Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology. As I have mentioned, the passage around which Marratto builds his account is that each subject's reflective grasp of him/herself is founded on 'an original past, a past which has never been present'. This paradoxical thesis comes at the end of Merleau-Ponty's chapter on 'sensing' (Le Sentir), and it is clear from the context that this 'original past' is the work of the senses, sensation, which has provided us with a perceived world in which we find ourselves as subjects, but which was not itself originally 'present' to us as an experience of which we were conscious. As Merleau-Ponty remarks, perception is fundamentally unreflective; it 'is always in the mode of the impersonal "One"' (PhP 277; CS 240, DL 249). Merleau-Ponty connects these impersonal perceptions to the senses, to 'my eyes, hands and ears, which are so many natural selves (Moi naturels)' (PhP 250: CS 216, DL 224); but he goes on to emphasize the bodily integration of the senses, which informs our capacities for organized bodily behaviour. For, as he puts it, 'With the notion of the body schema (schéma corporel) we find that not only is the unity of the body described in a new way, but also, through this, the unity of the senses and of the object' (PhP 271: CS 235, DL 244). It is, then, in this sense that 'perceiving as we do with our body, the body is a natural self and, as it were, the subject of perception' (PhP 239: CS 206, DL 213).

Marratto provides much helpful discussion of these difficult themes. In discussing the central role of the body schema, he draws attention to the fundamental role which Merleau-Ponty assigns to the expressive powers of bodily movement. Thus the passage cited just above from PhP 271 (CS 235, DL 244) continues:

My body is the seat or rather the very actuality of the phenomenon of expression (Ausdruck), and in the body the visual and auditory experiences, for example, are pregnant with one another, and their expressive value is the ground of the antepredicative unity of the perceived world, and, through it, of verbal expression (Darstellung) and intellectual significance (Bedeutung).

Merleau-Ponty here looks back to the gestural account of verbal expression which he has introduced in the previous chapter of PhP (Part I, chapter VI: 'The Body as Expression, and Speech'), and which he develops into an account of language and 'intellectual significance' in the later chapter on the 'Cogito' (Part III. chapter I). But what remains obscure is the fundamental 'phenomenon of expression' as exemplified by the 'expressive value' of visual and auditory experiences. Marratto suggests that Merleau-Ponty's position is that the contents of sense experience are determined by the meaning (sens) of movements which express these experiences. Although this appears right when one thinks of spatial contents, especially depth, which Marratto discusses at length, it does not apply readily to visual experiences of colours such as the red of a red rug.

Merleau-Ponty's discussion of this matter seems deliberately elusive, but his comparison between sense experience and the sacrament of Holy Communion suggests a different line of thought. He writes:

In the same way, the sensible does not merely have a motor and vital signification, but is rather nothing other than a certain manner of being in the world that is proposed to us from a point in space, that our body takes up and adopts if it is capable, and sensation is, literally, a communion. (PhP 245-6: CS 212, DL 219)

Since Communion is here being understood as involving transubstantiation, the claim here is that in sensation our bodies come into a similarly transformative relationship with sensible qualities, which one might interpret as a relationship by which these very qualities (colours, sounds etc.) enter into the content of sense experience and become available for further expressive elaboration. So I suggest that Marratto's reliance on expressive movement to capture spatial contents can be complemented by a relational account of other contents of sense experience such as colour and sound.

Marratto devotes considerable attention to the vexed question of the interpretation of Merleau-Ponty's 'tacit cogito' which supposedly underpins ordinary self-consciousness, the 'spoken cogito' of reflexive thought (PhP 461: CS 402, DL 424). Marratto connects this issue with our 'original past' which is the unreflective ground of reflective thought; hence he rejects M. C. Dillon's suggestion that the tacit cogito is a kind of corporeal reflexivity, since reflexivity necessarily brings with it presence of some kind, whereas this original past has 'never been present'. But drawing upon the themes already mentioned, Marratto suggests that what Merleau-Ponty has in mind is the potential for self-consciousness inherent in the expressive powers of the unreflective body, which is the 'natural subject' of perception. This must indeed be part of what Merleau-Ponty has in mind, though it fails to capture some of the things he writes, such as that through this tacit cogito, in advance of formulating his explicit cogito, Descartes 'at the outset, had his own existence in sight' (PhP 461: CS 402, DL 424). So there is more to be said here, though, as Merleau-Ponty himself acknowledged later, his account of the tacit cogito in PhP is inherently problematic.

As I mentioned at the start of this review, Marratto departs from PhP to introduce Merleau-Ponty's conception of intercorporeity, but I don't think he in fact employs Merleau-Ponty's conception of this as our being 'like organs of one single intercorporeity'. Instead what he has in mind is our capacity for an immediate unreflective grasp of the bodily movements of others, and in particular of the gestural expressions which, according to Merleau-Ponty, provide the beginnings of language. This is important for Marratto since it enables him to locate an unreflective appreciation of bodily expression within the 'original past' that is the unreflective ground of 'presence', i.e., self-conscious subjectivity, and thus break into the circle that in PhP connects language, intersubjectivity and subjectivity. This is an interesting suggestion, but these are issues that have been much discussed and debated by philosophers such as Wittgenstein, Grice, Davidson and Chomsky, and an adequate treatment of these foundational questions concerning the philosophy of language and thought would have to range much more widely than Marratto attempts in his brief discussion of them.

What Marratto does do, however, is connect his interpretation of Merleau-Ponty with some of Derrida's writings, of which he provides helpful brief expositions. Marratto's aim here is to defend Merleau-Ponty from the charge that he is guilty of the 'metaphysics of presence', of supposing that phenomenological investigations can disclose to us intuitive experiences through which certain fundamental meanings become evident. Marratto's defence is, of course, that by giving a central role to 'an original past, a past which has never been present', Merleau-Ponty shows that he is not guilty of the metaphysics of presence thus understood; and this is certainly a fair point. But Marratto does not explore the way in which in PhP (and later) Merleau-Ponty privileges 'authentic' expression in his account of 'speaking' speech. For this privilege does appear to be a residual manifestation of the metaphysics of presence within his philosophy of language.

As this review indicates I am not always persuaded by Marratto. But his book is a bold and brave attempt to provide a unified interpretation of the central themes of Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology, and as such it deserves to be welcomed and studied carefully by all those who value Merleau-Ponty's writings.