The Intersubjectivity of Time: Levinas and Infinite Responsibility

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Yael Lin, The Intersubjectivity of Time: Levinas and Infinite Responsibility, Duquesne University Press, 2013, 213pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704630.

Reviewed by Lawrence Vogel, Connecticut College


St. Augustine famously confesses: "What then is time? If no one asks me, I know what it is. If I wish to explain it to him who asks, I do not know." I find myself similarly bewildered by the multilayered, amorphous, shifting experience of time. So it's enticing, though ultimately disappointing, to read Yael Lin's linear story of progress in our understanding of time, the climax of which is Levinas' critique of Bergson and Heidegger's existential, but all too "egological," interpretations.

Chapter 1 sets the stage for the story. While Bergson and Heidegger properly show us the priority of lived time over scientific clock (or spatialized) time, Lin (following Levinas) argues, "[each remains] restricted to the perspective of the subject -- whether the subject is the individual or the homogeneous society of people." (53) Despite Bergson's ideal of "an open society" animated by love of humanity and hope for a messianic future (29), "Bergson makes no attempt to reveal the way in which different people characterized by their individual durations form intertemporal relations." (31) And even when Heidegger shifts his focus, towards the end of Being and Time, "from the individual Dasein to the we," he "perpetuates an organic notion of community that is devoid of genuine plurality." One must be cautious not to turn Heidegger into a liberal, but there are ways, I think, to rally to the defense of both Bergson and Heidegger for being less "egological" than Lin makes them sound. This would be a much longer story.

Chapter 2 introduces Levinas as the philosopher of intersubjective, pluralistic time. Although lived time has a public, common dimension, "its intersubjectivity consists in its existing in between the subjects constituted through their interaction." (80) The key to Levinas's turn to "the other" lies in his revision of the meaning that (the early) Heidegger attached to death. Against the idea that death individualizes Dasein, Levinas holds: "My solitude is not confirmed by death but broken by it . . . It is not my nonbeing that causes anxiety but that of the loved one or the other, more beloved than my own being." (71) Truly facing the other's mortality, on Levinas's interpretation, I am in the grip of ethical responsibility for the other's life, and this invests my life with meaning, for the ultimate meaning of human life lies not in "a happy ending" but in "suffering for the suffering of the other."

Levinas's turn to "the other" opens up "the pure, ungraspable future" beyond my finite time: "infinite" in the sense that desire for the good of the other is insatiable and points beyond the life of any particular person towards a messianic future that would itself be open-ended. Furthermore, responsibility for the other is "always already" given with the face, not rooted in a choice by the subject or a contract between subjects; in this sense it attests to "an immemorial past." In responsibility, Levinas claims, "infinity" is revealed as involving "a future that cannot be fulfilled and a past that was never present." (76)

Time manifests itself in "fecundity" (Chapter 3) and "diachrony" (Chapter 4). "Fecundity," elaborated in Totality and Infinity, means the power to engender a child. Though eros is the starting-point for fecundity, Levinas parts ways with Plato's Diotima, for "fecundity is not a means for an individual to attain immortality, but rather opens up a time that is beyond the subject's own time." (84) My child is not only mine; she is me. But she is also a stranger destined to live her own life, ideally in a world I will no longer share as she will outlive me. "The newness created by fecundity engenders infinity -- an infinite future -- rather than immortality." (83) Fecund time is "discontinuous" because the other "interrupts" my time, yet this interruption amounts to "continual rebirth." Lin agrees with Irigiray's criticism, however, that Levinas's account of fecundity remains "confined to the logic of egological time," for "the function of the other is still to give the subject a future." (103-04) My children renew my time.

Lin interprets Levinas's notion of "diachronic" time in Otherwise than Being as "an amplification of fecund time": a "deepening of the claim that time is constituted via the subject's relation with the other." (106) Her question is whether diachrony provides a more other-centered account of time than fecundity. Diachronic time is constituted when, in the face-to-face relationship, "the subject is responsible for the other to the point of dying for the other" (116). This point seems already to have been made prior to the introduction of "diachrony," however, and so it's not clear what the term adds except a new vocabulary that will be associated with other new terms like "proximity" and "substitution." Lin hopes that these terms will enrich the understanding of temporality that was introduced earlier in her discussion of infinite responsibility.

The introduction of "proximity," however, seems to pretty much repeat what has already been asserted. "In proximity," Lin tells us, "the subject is concerned with another individual and is interrupted by the infinite responsibility for the other." (123) Lin remains puzzled by how proximity -- the sense that "the closer you get to the other, the greater your responsibility towards him becomes" (122) -- constitutes time. Yet she already seems to have given us the answer, or at least as much of an answer as we shall get: proximity "disturbs" the subject because it "upholds the unbridgeable separation between the subject and the other." This implies that there is always more I can give to the point of self-sacrifice. Here is the sense in which disentanglement from oneself is pushed to the extreme in the time of infinite responsibility. But didn't we already learn this in Chapter 2?

The biggest problem here is that Lin never tries to justify the radical Levinasian assertion that the face of another person calls me to "total responsibility, which answers for all the others and for all in the others, even for their responsibility." (Ethics and Infinity, 99) Yet Levinas's account of "diachronic" time depends on the validity of this supposedly phenomenological description. The problem is exacerbated by Lin's (sparse) use of examples. It's easy enough to see the ethical response in an extreme moment of crisis like "Harry Ramos's decision to stay with a stranger named Victor instead of saving himself from the World Trade Center Building on September 11, 2001." (126) Lin's more ordinary example, however, is harder to decipher. She recounts waiting at a bus stop and ignoring a panhandler, but hearing an elderly woman mutter, "He should get a job." The woman proceeds to tell Lin her sad life-story, eliciting from Lin the following supposedly Levinasian interpretation:

By interrupting my thoughts with her story, my temporality was penetrated by the woman, leading me to leave myself and become disengaged from my identity . . . my temporal movement had been suspended by my [listening] to her demand, causing an arrhythmia in my egological time.

This point might have been made, more elegantly, by Martin Buber. Lin conflates the time of dialogue and the time of dying-for-the-other. The beggar was left to his own devices. The elderly woman was left to wait for her husband. Does "proximity" call for more than momentarily lending an ear? The question is never broached. The upshot here is: "The reaching out of a person to another is the stretching out of time." (130) One might well agree, but without buying Levinas's radical assertion that I am "hostage" to the other. To my mind, Lin never satisfactorily builds a bridge from listening to helping, from dialogue to sacrifice. In this respect, her own account remains too "egological" by Levinas's exacting standards.

In Chapter 5, Lin moves from the ethical to the political level. She worries that Levinas's account of time, grounded in the face-to-face encounter, is limited because it "does not involve the community of people." (133) She acknowledges that Levinas's idea of "the third party" lets him move from ethics (where I must give all to the particular other whom I face) to justice (where each of us is but 'one among others' requiring fairness). Criticizing Levinas on the grounds that "[his] interpretation of time is still too limited to the relation between one person and another and does not take into account the third party," (134) Lin offers a friendly amendment: an account of public Judaic prayer in which "the community is tied together in an immemorial covenant of responsibility" wherein "the trace of illeity disrupts the temporality of each individual forming a nontotalizing dimension of collective time." (154)

The above formulation remains dark in Chapter 5, though Lin perhaps sheds light on it in an engaging final section, "Afterthoughts," where she develops an interpretation of the Athens/Jerusalem distinction based on different images of time in the Greek myth of Cronos and the Biblical stories of Abraham and Moses. In the Greek myth, Father Time "ravages and destroys all that it creates . . . devouring past and future into the present." (161) The Akedah, by contrast, is a paradigm of "fecund time," for "Abraham obeys God's command in order to keep his covenant with God that promises the extension of his possibilities not as an individual but as the founder of a nation." (164) Likewise, "when Moses takes upon himself the fate of the Israelites and dies in the desert in their place . . . the time of a nation is created." Moses illustrates how the meaning of the future lies in responsibility for the other to the point of dying for the other. (172)

The Promised Land, however, is marked by "a surplus of responsibility towards humanity" (178) Levinas's ambivalence over the state of Israel stems from the worry that "Israel, as a Jewish state, [must] prevent the assimilation of its non-Jewish others -- Muslim Arabs, Christian Arabs, Druzes, and Circassians -- and allow them to preserve their alterity." (180) Public Jewish prayer is a reminder of a "pure, absolute, messianic future" in which collective time is continually disrupted by responsibility for those who are not "our own." One senses that Lin positions herself on the Israeli left, but it's hard to see where she takes this politically because her formulations remain so abstract.

For the reasons I have presented, Lin's book is unlikely to reach beyond an audience of Levinas aficionados, and, among them it will not persuade those who don't already accept Levinas's driving premise: that the best response to the "egological" focus of Heidegger's account of authenticity is dying-for-the-other. Is it true, however, that any other at all is "more beloved to me than my own being"?