The Invention of a People: Heidegger and Deleuze on Art and the Political

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Janae Sholtz, The Invention of a People: Heidegger and Deleuze on Art and the Political, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 289pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748685356.

Reviewed by Antonio Calcagno, King's University College, Canada


Philosophers familiar with the work of both Heidegger and Deleuze are generally struck by the seeming irreconcilability of the two philosophers' projects. Deleuze, who was an eminent scholar of the history of philosophy, had very little to say about Heidegger, and yet both figures were interested in the same thinkers, including Kant, Leibniz and Nietzsche. There appears to be a chasm between the two giants of 20th century European philosophy, but work over the last few years has sought to create a bridge between the thinker of being and the philosopher of difference and multiplicity. The work of Gavin Rae (Ontology in Heidegger and Deleuze, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014) shows that Deleuze and Heidegger shared both similar and opposed concerns about the question of being. More recently, Janae Sholtz's book extends the conversation between the two philosophers by focusing on the question of art and its relation to politics.

In her Introduction, Sholtz begins with one of the fundamental questions of politics, namely, what allows people to form a union or community in order to build a political reality together? Drawing upon Heidegger's Mitsein and his conception of the Volk (a people), which has been severely criticized by scholars, Sholtz maintains that a connection can be made with Deleuze: "We maintain that Deleuze continues this line of thinking (of being-with), and can be situated within this tradition of attempting to rethink the boundaries of community in the post-war climate." (11) In particular, she argues that though Deleuze insists on various formations and structures that deterritorialise, undo and challenge prevailing and dominant state structures, including that of a people, one must not forget that, for Deleuze, the aforementioned destabilising structures also work with and in established, powerful structures. We know, for example, that in A Thousand Plateaus the nomadic can never be fully separated from the royal, the State.

Deleuze's political ontology emerges from a refusal to break with (to seek transcendence from) the real conditions of deterritorialised flows of capital and consumption that threaten to close in upon us, eradicating our ability to think otherwise. His micropolitics hinges on the possibility of the 'minor', of formations that elude national boundaries, state hierarchy and identity, racial or otherwise, yet which operate from within, immanent to the system under scrutiny. Significantly, Deleuze maintains Heidegger's language of a 'people' rather than eschewing such language in favour of talk of 'community' (11)

Sholtz rightly reminds readers that though Deleuze's political philosophy certainly challenges dominant paradigms and regimes of power, it nonetheless requires established and authoritative forms of power and state control: the rhizomatic exits with and is conditioned by the arboreal. The repositioning of Deleuze facilitates a conversation with Heidegger. She remarks,

We argue that Deleuze is reluctant to leave Heidegger behind because he recognises that the impasse of thinking requires a particular ontological dispensation, i.e. the issue of a people is essentially connected to the reformulation of immanence, the earth, through an engagement with the essence of art. (12)

The Invention of a People consists of three parts and a conclusion. In Part I, Sholtz provides a reading of Heidegger's and Deleuze's reading of Nietzsche, who is fundamental for understanding the relation between art and politics. "Heidegger claims that in order to understand what is actually being said by Nietzsche when he names art as a configuration of the will to power we must examine his proposition in light of the question of aesthetics." (31) In order to show what art is, understood as a kind of bringing forth, Sholtz traces out six stages in the development of Heidegger's reading of aesthetics. (33 -- 37) She argues that though Heidegger follows Nietzsche along certain lines when it comes to the question of being and the overcoming of metaphysics, especially Platonic ontology, Heidegger diverges from Nietzsche insofar as the former wishes to think what is unthought. The unthought is to be understood as overcoming. In order to engage the question of being and the unthought "man must hold his nature open for once to the essential relation toward Being." (43) Human beings become redefined by their relation to being. Sholtz further maintains, "Heidegger's own formulation of the essential nature of man is developed out of a reflection on Nietzsche here, as a response and alternative interpretation of a possible future people" (43)

Sholtz notes that Deleuze had little patience for Heidegger's claims about the end of philosophy as metaphysics (47), yet she notes that Deleuze did have an interest in adding to Bergson's claim that modern science had not found its metaphysics. She unpacks for her readers what Deleuze understood by metaphysics by examining his view of Nietzsche, especially around questions of reversal, subjectivism, a theory of forces and the eternal return. (49) Rather than focus on the question of the human that becomes redefined by the question of being, Sholtz argues that Deleuze, like Heidegger, sees in Nietzsche the need to be open to being, especially developed in Deleuze's notion of the "strolling couple, affect-event." (67) She observes,

Deleuze's philosophy leans toward the thought of the infinite, to maintain just enough consistency to become imperceptible. This is one reason the Overman is ultimately, always to come, characterised as it is by a perpetual openness forged out of a wrenching bi-directionality -- surprisingly reminiscent of the Heideggerian rift, which is also constituted out of difference. Thus, the issue is not one of dictating a new form of humanity, but of maintaining the conditions of openness. (68)

Part II, "(Un)Thinking, What must be Thought", focuses on the opening that art provides and its transformative potential for politics in both Heidegger and Deleuze. Sholtz argues that Heidegger wishes to think a new beginning for the human and for art. Reading closely Heidegger's essays on art and technology as well as his writings on Hölderlin, the reader sees how Heidegger provides the possibility of a new poetic dwelling: "Out of the relationship between art, the poet and the thinker, Heidegger posits the necessity of human essence as poetic dwelling, thus human beings become preservers of being -- though attunement, language and decision." (112) If language is the house of being, as Heidegger claims, then language can open up possibilities of new beginnings as being itself is open-ended: the poet creates language and thus expands our understanding of ourselves, our world and our being.

The poet grounds existence which is not yet but arises out of this gathering of paths and relations . . . .The medium through which the sojourn takes place is language, which is one of the poles, the primary pole, around which a polis gathers. When being is gathered in a certain historical moment, Heidegger claims, the possibility for decision arises. (112)

The second half of Part II concentrates on Deleuze. Sholtz mines the classic Deleuzian sources on art and gives a solid reading of key concepts, including those found in the Logics of Sensation and the Cinema Books I and II. Noting how important earth is for Heidegger's take on art and how Deleuze repositions our understanding of earth (while implicitly critiquing Heidegger) by allowing the earth to ask its own questions -- How does the earth understand itself? -- Sholtz makes the convincing case that we also have to look at both philosophers' views of the planetary.

In his late philosophy, Heidegger does introduce a new concept, the planetary, which could be seen as an intermediary in moving us from earth to the cosmic. Extending beyond 'world' as culturally and linguistically immanent, Heidegger appeals to the planetary, seemingly as a positive future path for thinking (125 -- 126).

Sholtz draws upon the work of Kostos Axelos in order to bridge the work of Heidegger and Deleuze on art and its possibilities of opening and becoming, possibilities central for Heidegger's project:

Deleuze recognised Axelos' revisions of the planetary as important innovations on Heidegger's ontology, which mirror his own understanding of the open dynamism of being as becoming -- especially errancy and game. Therefore, Axelos represents a conceptual bridge which leads us away from the Heideggerian figuration of world and earth and necessitates a new figure, one that even surpasses that of the planetary -- which, we believe, remains mired for Deleuze in the residue of Heidegger's thinking -- toward the cosmic. (128 -- 129)

Having established the convergence of Deleuze and Heidegger on the possibilities of becoming, especially in and through a new approach to art, Part III, "(Un)Earthing a People-to-Come", seeks to expound the relationship between art and politics. In many ways, this is the most important chapter of the book and the most challenging, especially given Heidegger's own Nazism and Deleuze's own tough stance against Fascism and totalitarianism. One of the possibilities offered by art is the articulation and formation of a people-to-come, people being understood as a possible communion of persons that aims at dwelling together in one form or another. For Heidegger, according to Sholtz, a people-to-come is conditioned by an understanding of art as gathering place (Ort) "for the historical destiny of a people which constructs the earth as a homeland (Heimat)" (191). Deleuze is presented as offering art as yielding the possibility of creating a people that is both cosmic and minor.

In A Thousand Plateaus, Deleuze presents a model of group formation that draws upon the elements of the aesthetics of territory formation . . . The good group, as opposed to the mass characterized by homogeneity and indistinctiveness, follows the model of the pack, characterized by heterogeneous parts and the anomalous as a bounding yet fluid ordering structure. This conception of group interaction addresses the problem of inclusivity and exclusivity and represents the politics of becoming by conceiving of a collectivity as a multiplicity-assemblage, emphasising the fringe (minoritarian), contagion (change), and the between (relations), which affirms the absolutely contingent as a positive and necessary condition. (244)

Both thinkers are ultimately read as opening possibilities of different kinds of people to emerge, the invention of a people being understood as the foundation of any politics. Sholtz posits that whether a people become wanderers (Heidegger) or nomads (Deleuze), the important thing is the possibilities of openings that art offers in helping build such possibilities. Important for Sholtz is the ethics that emerge from Deleuze's concept of a people or group, an ethos that diverges from Heidegger's own personal views. Sholtz views Deleuzian ethics as: (1) responsibility to others, including the human and nonorganic, that form and in-form us; (2) the freeing of the molecular and developing a sensitivity to the affect; and (3) responsibility for the worlds that are engendered. (259) She claims that "Deleuze's philosophy offers an open, dynamic concept of group interaction which can be marshaled for thinking what it means to be a people beyond borders, nations, or race, corresponding to the continuously transforming place of immanence." (259 -- 260)

The conclusion of the book revisits the notion of becoming as a fluxus that is "always to come." (279) Randomness and uncertainty are risks embedded within this kind of becoming that art offers. "Whatever a people-to-come will be, it must be a moving concept, one that enjoins itself to the flux and flows of life, in order to be equal to the conditions of life, creation and immanence." (279) On the whole, Sholtz gives readers a new way of understanding the relationship between Deleuze and Heidegger in terms of their understanding of the connection between art and politics. Deleuzians will be troubled by the attempt to read group relations and interactions in terms of Derridean-influenced notion of a people-to-come. Heideggerians will be disturbed by the over emphasis on a possible future that does not fully account for the force of historicity and epochs on the making of specific kinds of peoples here and now. Sholtz reminds readers, however, that though both Heidegger and Deleuze share similar concerns about being, art and politics, the two thinkers also diverge from one another in significant ways.