The Ironist and the Romantic: Reading Richard Rorty and Stanley Cavell

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Áine Mahon, The Ironist and the Romantic: Reading Richard Rorty and Stanley Cavell, Bloomsbury, 2014, 195pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474265898.

Reviewed by Andrew Norris, University of California, Santa Barbara


The idea of a book comparing and contrasting Richard Rorty and Stanley Cavell is such a good one that it is a surprise that a book on the topic is not already at hand. Born five years apart and possessed of similarly resplendent academic pedigrees, the two share an enormous amount, particularly when considered in the context of the general practice of the discipline of philosophy in America. Neither could have emerged as we know him in any context but that of the post-war "linguistic turn" to which Rorty devoted an early and important collection;[1] and both pushed through the concern with propositions and sentences to one with texts, Cavell announcing in The Claim of Reason (published the same year as Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature) his intention "to understand philosophy not as a set of problems but as a set of texts" and Rorty describing the best philosophy written in the wake of Hegel's Phenomenology as "literary criticism."[2] Rorty's argument in Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity that political morality is best understood in terms of Sellars' "we-intentions" echoes Cavell's earlier focus on the political use of the first person plural.[3] Both reject the positivist's fact/value distinction,[4] and, in part on that ground, both see philosophy not as a (super-)science but as a mode of conversation in which the primary virtue is openness to the transformative power of the new.[5] For similar reasons both draw significantly upon the example of Hegel, though Rorty is as eager to contrast him to Kant as Cavell is to suggest similarities between the two.[6] And so on; such examples are easily multiplied. But the most striking commonality between the two is the ambition to work across the "Analytic" and "Continental" divide in philosophy, to draw upon Heidegger as well as Wittgenstein, and address Derrida as well as Putnam. For both this ambition is tied to the desire to push philosophy into a wider engagement with cultural and political life -- a push that is often resisted by a discipline eager to justify itself with a show of professional methods and expertise. As Áine Mahon notes, in this effort both turn to neglected figures in American philosophy, placing greater emphasis upon their "native tradition [than] traditions of discipline or department" (43).

But, as Mahon also emphasizes, Rorty and Cavell are deeply at odds in their specific conceptions of what the new or (for Rorty) post-philosophical culture should look like. Indeed, they apparently felt far enough apart that, aside from Rorty's ambivalent review of The Claim of Reason and some occasional disparaging remarks concerning Cavell's regrettable, inexplicable tendency to "go all existential" about the supposedly perennial question of skepticism, they have almost never referred to one another in their published work.[7] One of the reasons Mahon's effort to bring the two into conversation is so welcome is that they largely avoided that themselves. The distance between them comes out not just in their specific proposals but, more fundamentally, in their approach and tone. Where Rorty advances "sweeping narratives," Cavell pursues "detailed excavations" (31); and where Rorty's characteristic phrases are reductive (something seemingly important like truth is "just" something quite unremarkable), Cavell's hint at obscure profundities (it is "as if" something apparently unremarkable were of decisive importance). This is reflected in their respective choices of an American forbearer who might exemplify their visions of what philosophy is and should become.

For Rorty, American philosophy at its best is that of the straightforward Dewey; for Cavell, it is that of the elliptical Emerson. For all of Dewey's acknowledged debts to Emerson, whom he named "the Philosopher of Democracy," the differences between the two are significant.[8] Cavell may exaggerate Dewey's commitment to scientific method in explaining why Emerson is not a pragmatist (or, as Dewey would have preferred, an instrumentalist), but it remains true that central Emersonian concerns with textuality, conversion, mourning, and the loss and recovery of self and world are quite foreign to Dewey -- and to Rorty.[9] Rorty and Cavell model two very different ways of practicing as well as conceiving of philosophy, and the force of their examples is unlikely to fade any time soon. Whether those examples will play an important role in "the ongoing development of Anglo-American philosophy" (11) is harder to say. It is difficult if amusing to imagine either participating in a contemporary discussion of, say, neuroscience and ethics.

As her title indicates, Mahon casts her contrast between the two in terms of irony and romanticism. This is a natural and helpful device, if one that, as she notes, should not be applied too strictly. Rorty celebrates irony in private life, but is anything but ironic in his engagements with political questions, where solidarity and hope are the watchwords.[10] And, while he is hardly a romantic of Cavell's stripe, in late essays like "Pragmatism and Romanticism" he does celebrate the decisive presence of the latter in the former, as he understands it. Similarly, Cavell's romanticism entails a painstaking and ongoing engagement with philosophical skepticism quite unlike anything found in even Coleridge or the Schlegels. And if irony names events that are the opposite of what was expected, Cavell's reading of philosophy is of a deeply ironic venture, one in which the philosopher never quite knows what he is doing or not doing, and who struggles to truly mean what he says (cf. 148).

Mahon divides her study into five chapters, addressing in turn skepticism, pragmatism, the literary, philosophical style, and politics. The book is written in a brisk and accessible style, and will be particularly helpful to students and others relatively new to these figures. At times Mahon moves a little too quickly to do justice to the complexities of the arguments involved. This is more problematic when it comes to Cavell, which is unfortunate given that he generally seems to get the better of Rorty in Mahon's eyes when she contrasts the two. Some of the mistakes here are minor: "The Availability of Wittgenstein's Later Philosophy" is Cavell's fourth published essay, not his first (17), and neither irony nor romanticism could be said to be Wittgensteinian "forms of life" (6).

Others are more significant. Cavell does not claim that "claims to knowledge are authorized, if it all, from first-person experience" (8), as he does not deny that one can know things about, say, mathematics or history, and he does not insist that my knowledge of my native language be authorized by experience or anything else. Cavell does not argue that the skeptic's claim is "'phenomenologically unfaithful'" (18); indeed, two pages before the page Mahon cites in this regard he writes, "the philosopher's originating question . . . is a response to, or expression of, a real experience that takes hold of human beings."[11] And Cavell does not argue that the "fundamental distinction between knowing what a thing is (knowledge as identification or recognition) and knowing that it is (knowledge as existence or reality) is a difference not taken into account by the philosopher of traditional epistemology" (19). When Cavell writes, "Criteria are 'criteria for something's being so,' not in the sense that they tell us of a thing's existence, but of something like its identity, not of its being so, but of its being so," he is (consciously, I believe) echoing Kant's claim that "being is not a predicate" that might be attributed to God by definition by virtue of His perfection so as to prove His existence.[12] The traditional philosopher considers a generic object (e.g., Descartes' ball of wax) precisely to isolate the question of existence from that of identity; and Cavell distinguishes himself from Austin by not rejecting this attempt out of hand but considering the details of what it involves and why exactly it fails. This is significant because Mahon's slips here make it hard for her to bring into view Cavell's central, paradoxical claim regarding what he calls "the truth of skepticism." And if this is not brought into view, it is difficult -- Mahon's own apparent preference for Cavell over Rorty notwithstanding -- not to conclude with Rorty that skepticism is better set aside as simply no longer interesting.

That said, Mahon is quite right not to aspire for a conclusive accounting of the two that might establish who is right about what, or whom we should take as a more helpful alternative to the way in which philosophy is currently pursued. As Rorty observes in one of his best essays, "Solidarity or Objectivity?," adopting James' language of "live options," there are those "who have always hoped to become a New Being, who have hoped to be converted rather than persuaded. But we -- the liberal Rawlsian searchers for consensus, the heirs of Socrates, the people who wish to link their days dialectically each to each -- cannot do so."[13] The former is a reasonable rough sketch of Cavell, who makes the Emersonian call for conversion a centerpiece of his life's work, and early on writes of Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations, "Belief is not enough. Either the suggestion penetrates past assessment and becomes part of the sensibility from which assessment proceeds, or it is philosophically useless."[14] Whether one finds Rorty's breezy "ethnocentric" dismissal shallow and unreflective, or Cavell's quasi-religious demand for a New Day or "eventual everyday" ponderous or disturbing is, as both knew well, not something that a critical argument alone might determine. Mahon's book will have served its purpose well if it leads its readers back to its two brilliant subjects, to determine for themselves whom they shall follow, and how far.

[1] Rorty's The Linguistic Turn: Essays in Philosophical Method (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992) was originally published in 1967, two years before Cavell's Must We Mean What We Say? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969), a collection containing groundbreaking studies of the ordinary language philosophy of Austin and Wittgenstein.

[2] Cavell, The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1979), 3; Rorty, Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989), 79.

[3] Cavell, The Claim of Reason, 25f.; Rorty, Contingency, Irony, Solidarity, 190f.

[4] Cavell, The Claim of Reason, 94; Rorty, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979), 363f.

[5] Cavell, The Claim of Reason, 254f; Rorty, Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, 372.

[6] While the ubiquitous presence of Kant in Cavell's texts is plain, his debts to Hegel are not always as obvious. He has written that the source for the phrase "the truth of skepticism" is "Hegel's use of 'the truth of x' where x is a concept he has just sublated, denied at one level but preserved at another." Cavell, "Reply to Four Chapters," Wittgenstein and Skepticism, ed. D. McManus (New York: Routledge, 2004) 289. More substantively, his account of the necessity of the skeptic's turn to the generic object recalls Hegel's account in the "Sense Certainty" chapter of the Phenomenology of Spirit of the need of natural consciousness to eschew the use of all mediating categories and predicates that rest upon comparison between objects. Cavell's argument that the skeptic is trying to mean something that he cannot mean when he discusses a generic object echoes Hegel's argument that such a natural consciousness cannot say what it means when it says that it is certain that this particular thing is here and now, as every attempt to refer to the particularity of the this that is here and now uses general terms ("here," "now") that, as such, can refer to other particulars, and hence fail on their own to pick out this one that is here now. For both, the conclusion is that "Die Sprache aber ist . . . das Wahrhaftere." Hegel,Phänomenologie des Geistes, eds. Eva Moldenhauer and Karl Markus Michel (Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp, 1969), 85.

[7] Rorty, "Cavell on Skepticism," Consequences of Pragmatism (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982), 181 and, e.g., Rorty, "Wittgenstein and the Linguistic Turn,"Philosophy as Cultural Politics: Philosophical Papers, Volume 4 (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007), 173.

[8] Dewey, "Ralph Waldo Emerson," Emerson: A Collection of Critical Essays, ed. M. Konvitz and S. Whicher (Englewood Cliffs: Prentice-Hall, 1962), 29, emphasis mine.

[9] Cavell, "What's the Use of Calling Emerson a Pragmatist?" Emerson's Transcendental Etudes (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2003), 216f. Rorty argues that though "Dewey never stopped talking about 'scientific method,' . . . he never had anything very useful to say about it." Cited in Alan Malachowski, "Rorty's Contribution," in The Cambridge Companion to Pragmatism, ed. Malachowski (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013), 214.

[10] Dewey is, after all, no ironist.

[11] Cavell, The Claim of Reason, 140, emphasis mine. Cavell does not actually use the phrase Mahon quotes, but writes instead,

Various ranges of problems may be seen to emerge concerning the phenomenological faithfulness of epistemological reconstruction. . . . What I now wish to suggest, or report, is this. The experiences in these recent stories [including that of being mistaken concerning what he was certain was on the radio] do not, for me, more than resemble the experience I am looking for to account for the initiation of the Cartesian investigation (CR 142).

That is, the experience that accounts for the initiation of the Cartesian investigation is different, not unreal.

[12] Cavell, The Claim of Reason, 45 and Kant, Critique of Pure Reason, trans. N. K. Smith (New York: Macmillan, 1929), 505.

[13] Rorty, "Solidarity or Objectivity?" The Pragmatism Reader: From Peirce through the Present, ed. R. Talisse and S. Aikin (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011), 374.

[14] Cavell, "The Availability of Wittgenstein's Later Philosophy," Must We Mean What We Say? 71.