The Irony of Heidegger

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Andrew Haas, The Irony of Heidegger, Continuum, 2007, 180pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826497963.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University


After reading a good deal of Heidegger, we start to hear his tones of voice and anticipate his rhetorical strategies. We recognize, for instance, that his lecture courses deliberately pile tension upon tension. We realize that he often pursues a line of thought simply in order to build a house of cards that he will then blow down. Certain words he uses drip with sarcasm, such as freischwebend (free-floating) and harmlos (innocuous). When Heidegger characterizes any viewpoint in these terms, it's a giveaway that he is offering the position a final cigarette before submitting it to his philosophical firing squad.

In Andrew Haas' The Irony of Heidegger, then, one might expect to find an interpretation that explored Heidegger's tonalities and tropes in the light of the content of his thought -- but one's expectations might be confounded.

What does Haas' title mean? He does not insist that Heidegger is deliberately ironic, but suggests that "a threat of irony" (xi) haunts the texts of this "most serious of philosophers" (2); we thus ought to "question both the serious and the ironic" to the point where we "become uncertain of this difference" (167). Haas claims to be defending philosophy against the threat of irony (xii, 167), but this would seem to be the sort of defense that overcomes a threat by incorporating it, by embracing the undecidability of the serious and the ironic, to the point that Haas provokes us to wonder whether he himself is being serious, ironic, or both.

Haas finds the threat of irony at work in a series of canonical Heideggerian texts. His strategy is to consider certain key moments, concepts, or gestures in each text and show that they rely on distinctions that undercut themselves, pointing to impossibilities. This strategy and Haas' own rhetoric will immediately seem familiar to anyone acquainted with Derrida, but Haas is more willing than Derrida to consider the possibility that the author is in control of the effects of his text. Haas often suggests that Heidegger may be well aware of the self-deconstruction of his own concepts.

Haas' discussion of Being and Time rightly points out that by beginning with a quotation from Plato's Sophist, Heidegger raises the specter of sophistry. "Can we now trust that the philosopher's text is not sophistical?" (12). Haas leaves this question open, but tries to show that Being and Time creates a number of unsolved and even insoluble aporias. Not only is the text incomplete, but it demonstrates that "we can never answer the question of what we really mean by the word 'being'" (14) for being lies "beyond meaning and meaninglessness alike" (15). The phenomenological project of showing what shows itself is riddled with doubt, "For who can say with certainty that the veil does not conceal another veil? That the depth of veiling is not infinite?" (30). "Everything can turn into -- or look like, show itself as -- everything else" (31). Heidegger tells us that being is concealed initially and usually (zunächst und zumeist: Being and Time, German p. 35). In Haas' reading, being is "that which should never show itself" yet is caught up in the ambiguity between self-showing and mere semblance (34). As for our own being, perhaps we "cannot understand" it (17) and the interpretation of Dasein is "impossible" (20). The possibility of the "sham of authenticity" makes it "impossible" to distinguish the authentic from the inauthentic (40). In short, Being and Time is pervaded by the uncertainty of "the difference of the sham and the real, authentic and inauthentic, original and copy, and of irony and seriousness themselves" (41).

Haas turns to the uncertainties and ambiguities in Heidegger's Rectoral Address: is Heidegger a fascist and a liar, or isn't he? What if the address "is a defence [of the German university] that is designed not to succeed, but to fail -- and spectacularly so? What then?" (48). Haas points out that the speech is structured as a series of "if we will" statements. He trades on the ambiguity of semblance and self-showing to argue that we cannot know what we will (60), and that "everything [in the speech] could itself be mere semblance, simulation, parody, malefic masquerade" (54).

"The Origin of the Work of Art" comes in for a similar reading. Heidegger claims that in great artworks, truth is at work. But his examples are well known to be problematic: what Heidegger calls Van Gogh's painting of the shoes of a peasant woman may in fact be a painting of Van Gogh's own shoes, as art historian Meyer Schapiro has argued. However, Schapiro makes his own questionable assumptions about truth (77-79). "Like the lecture itself, does not the work of art show the impossibility of pure presentation? Demonstrate how truth cannot happen in the painting?" (76). If truth is unconcealment, but unconcealment denies us an absolute ground, then "we never touch down on the secure firmament of truth, nor have we determined the certainty of untruth; we fall into an abyss" (89) "which can never be true or untrue" (90). Thus the question of the origin of art "cannot be answered" (93).

Haas reads the "Letter on 'Humanism'" in terms of Plato's allegory of the cave for, according to Heidegger, the allegory marks the beginning of "humanism" in his sense. On Haas' reading of Plato, perhaps "the only truth is that we cannot look at the truth of the sun" and "there is no outside the cave" (112); wisdom would lie in "knowing that we do not know (the truth of appearance -- for it too is an appearance) because we cannot know" (113). If we cannot know ourselves, then the humanistic attempt to fix the human essence must fail, as must the Heideggerian attempt to understand the human essence as the shepherd of being (120): "How would we be certain that the experience [of being] is authentic? Especially if it is an impossible one … if being is constantly in withdrawal?" (126). In short, "we never get any nearer to being than we've ever been" (131).

In interpreting "The Question Concerning Technology," Haas proposes that it is impossible to distinguish ancient technê from modern technology: "the Rhine is infinitely multiple in its possible meanings," and since there is no "absolute Rhine," who can say which uses of the river are abuses (150)? Haas enlists Heisenberg in an argument that phenomenology is bound to fail to discover pure nature or pure technê (150-153), much less honest technê -- for technê is always able to "deceive, trick, con, sham" (156).

Haas concludes with a brief look at Heidegger's 1966 interview with Der Spiegel, which is already notorious for its slippery ambiguities. He suggests that Heidegger's pronouncement that "only a god can still save us" calls for an "impossible preparation for a god that will not come because it cannot come" (163).

Has Haas shown that the threat of irony lurks in these key texts? This question has to be answered on several levels.

First, "irony" as Haas understands it is primarily an object of logical rather than rhetorical analysis. In other words, instead of considering how Heidegger's tropes guide his audience, or investigating Heidegger's philosophical purposes in choosing to express himself as he does, Haas tends to seize on certain concepts in the texts and subject them to stock dialectical procedures, such as applying a concept to itself or combining it with its opposite. These moves are meant to dissolve rigid oppositions and judgments, and thus reveal irony in Haas' sense: "The essence of irony lies in uncertainty" (13). The rhetorical dimension is not absent from Haas' interpretation, but the dialectical approach predominates. A satisfying investigation of Heidegger's rhetoric, in the light of issues such as those he raises in his 1924 lectures on Aristotle's Rhetoric (Gesamtausgabe vol. 18), is not to be found in this book.

A more rhetorically attuned analysis would not have assumed that irony is conceptually opposed to seriousness (xi, 167). If irony has an opposite, it is a flat-footed, indicative declaration of supposed facts. More precisely, there are several alternatives to this declarative mode, including Socratic irony, Kierkegaardian humor, and Heideggerian sarcasm. None of these stances pretends to exclude seriousness. Socrates' irony expresses his serious commitment to a quest for absolutes and his awareness of human finitude. Kierkegaard's humor is based on the incongruity between the infinite seriousness of the task of existing and the triviality and self-deception of most of the ways in which we exist. Heidegger's sarcasm is based on his serious passion for the opposite of all that is freischwebend and harmlos: rooted engagement.

But let us focus on the logical "irony" that is Haas' concern. He obfuscates the question of whether the major paradoxes he lays out are intentional on Heidegger's part: "if Heidegger says what he means, he doesn't, which means that he may never have said what he meant, or could say what he meant, but that means that he might in fact say what he means all along, and maybe not" (129). But it is not hard to dispel this smoke and understand Heidegger's intentions: two passages in Being and Time make it nearly impossible to suppose that Heidegger is deliberately inviting a dialectical analysis that indicates the impossibility of truth. First, here and everywhere Heidegger sees dialectic as a misuse of logos that tries to subordinate being to propositional thinking: Platonic dialectic, for example, is "a genuine philosophical embarrassment" (Being and Time, German p. 25; cf. 286, 300-301, 432). Secondly, according to Heidegger, truth as unconcealment is so fundamental to our condition that a sincere attempt to do away with it would amount to "suicide" (p. 229). Of course one could proceed to deconstruct the concept of suicide, but Heidegger would hardly condone such a move.

It is true that Heidegger himself tries to deconstruct many traditional conceptual structures, but he does so phenomenologically, not dialectically: that is, he makes a case that the tradition fails to describe the phenomena incisively enough, not that the traditional concepts are formally inconsistent or incomplete. It is also true that in his later texts Heidegger insists on the self-concealment or withdrawal of being, but we are supposed to experience this withdrawal as a kind of truth and gift. The self-concealment of being is not the conclusion of a dialectical argument, but an event that demands that we discern it and think of it.

Haas' intermittent suggestion that the "irony" is intentional can thus be set aside, at least when it comes to his argument that unconcealment itself is a self-destroying notion. But such paradoxes may nevertheless be unfolding behind Heidegger's back and against his wishes. This is a more plausible proposal, and many of Haas' arguments are worth considering in this light. His analyses are frequently thought-provoking and raise objections that are all too often absent from more pious and orthodox interpretations of Heidegger. But unfortunately, despite his fondness for the interrogative form -- some pages of this book are peppered with question marks -- Haas has a tendency to abort genuine questioning by leaping to the conclusion that a certain goal or concept is "impossible." If it is impossible to tell truth from untruth (40), and the experience of questioning is itself impossible (128-9), why bother?

Of all the arguments that Haas deploys, the most fundamental tries to dissolve the difference between being and seeming. If phainomenon means what shows itself, but false appearances also show themselves, then (Haas concludes) the very distinction between truth and sham breaks down (31-33, 167). This conclusion is a huge leap. Heidegger, for one, always insists that the struggle against concealment is difficult, uncertain, and never-ending -- but precisely for this reason, he holds on to the distinction between genuine being and mere semblance. Without the distinction, the struggle itself would be ludicrous.

Here and elsewhere, Haas' dialectic relies on false dichotomies and straw men. He effectively shows that certainty about many issues is elusive, but it does not follow that knowledge of all sorts is impossible. There is a third alternative between certainty and ignorance: finite unconcealment, which invites the philosophical search for a more profound unconcealment. Haas is all too ready to ignore this middle ground and to pick off easy targets, such as the ideals of "pure presentation" (76), an "objectively valid or universal criterion" (92), or a "closed axiomatic system of interpretation" (150). Heidegger also rejects all these ideals, but he does so in the name of a deeper understanding of truth, not in order to abandon truth itself.

The ambiguity between being and seeming is sophistry's stock in trade, and Haas' less than convincing arguments dare us to suspect that we are dealing with a sophist. Our suspicion is only heightened when, in true sophistical style, he questions our ability to recognize a sophist:

If sophists are the kinds of animals that always escape -- and even this escapes, remains unnoticed, or at least unnoticed as unnoticed, or noticed, because the unnoticed would be noticed, not noticed, or even un-unnoticed, that is, never to be noticed, that which could never be noticed as noticed or unnoticed -- well then how could we punish them? (12)

Like the problem of telling being from seeming, the problem of telling who is a philosopher and who is a sophist is genuine and enduring; but the essential difference between a philosopher and a sophist is not so difficult to grasp. It does not lie in the particular argumentative techniques they deploy, but in the intention that motivates the arguments. The aim of philosophical dialecticians, from Nagarjuna to Hegel, is to enlighten and liberate. The aim of sophistical dialecticians is to dazzle and seduce.

What, then, is Haas' aim? What is the larger goal of this study of Heidegger? Haas likes to ask, "What if?" and "What then?" but provides only the barest hint of an answer. There is a brief allusion to the standard postmodern line that our "desire for totality … culminates in totalitarianism" (55) and that "a totalitarian movement" cannot be grounded on a "non-ground" (58). But there is little moral or political impetus in this book as a whole. Instead, Haas sketches theories of art as improvisation (95-96) and of humanity as the face "which continues to efface itself in the facing" (135). This suggests a celebration of the anarchic play of appearances -- in short, the postmodern Nietzscheanism of a freischwebend free spirit for whom "Nietzsche is the thinker of the impossibility of totality, the uncertainty of unity" (56). Whether Nietzsche can plausibly be recruited as a friend of irony is debatable (see, for example, Part 8 of "The Use and Abuse of History"). It is at least clear that Nietzsche wants the active creation of new values, and it is unlikely that such creation will be stimulated by Haas' dialectical maneuvers. His dialectic, like that of the ancient skeptics, is more likely to lead to ataraxia -- it promotes uncertainty about both certainty and uncertainty themselves (62), leaving us as dazed and indecisive as Buridan's ass (64) until we cease to be perturbed by philosophy altogether.

Haas seems to identify irony with Socratic irony, but by confounding Socrates with the sophists he destroys the meaning of philosophy and the seriousness of Socratic irony. "The sophist's truth then is Socratic: he knows that he does not know because he cannot know, that the possibility of wisdom lies in the impossibility of knowledge" (12). Socrates

spends his life in play, hiding the hidden, concealing when revealing, pretending to accomplish the impossible in order to demonstrate its impossibility, feigning that he does not know, not because he knows, but because he knows that he does not know, and not because he could know, but because he cannot know. (155)

But would Socrates agree that he cannot know? The search for knowledge is nipped in the bud if we either assume that we already know, or assume that knowledge is impossible. Haas' Socrates could never search for knowledge or love wisdom; it is impossible to see why he would even try to distinguish himself from the (other) sophists, much less why he would give his life for philosophy.

Kierkegaard's investigation of Socratic irony speaks the plain truth about the sophist:

sophistry is precisely the everlasting duel of knowledge with the phenomenon in the service of egotism, which can never terminate the duel in a decisive victory because the phenomenon rises up again as quickly as it falls … only the knowledge that like a rescuing angel snatches the phenomenon from death and translates it from death to life can win. (The Concept of Irony, Princeton, 1989, pp. 25-26).

After Haas' laborious game, the phenomena that Heidegger considered will rise up again to demand that we engage in thought. We may hope that this rebirth is the ultimate goal of Haas' "defence of philosophy" (167).