The Kantian Aesthetic: From Knowledge to the Avant-Garde

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Paul Crowther, The Kantian Aesthetic: From Knowledge to the Avant-Garde, Oxford University Press, 2010, 209pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199579976.

Reviewed by Miles Rind, Independent Scholar


This book, the third by the author to use the "from-to" formula in its subtitle, aims to distinguish itself from most other recent work on its topic by its basic approach. Paul Crowther finds that recent work on Kant's aesthetic theory, for all its historical and exegetical virtues, tends "to see Kant's aesthetic theory as the problem to be solved rather than a basis for problem solving." Because this approach typically yields "interminable toings and froings between [Kant's] texts," Crowther dubs it "interminabilism" (p. 1). "Interminabilist" approaches to Kant's aesthetics, in his view, have several unfortunate consequences: they fail to give "a proper degree of critical scrutiny and revision of [Kant's] key concepts and arguments"; they "tend to avoid a sustained use of concrete examples"; they are "unacceptably self-referential" in how they explain the content of aesthetic judgments; they "tend to be constrained by a narrow concentration on Kant's own main interest -- the theory of taste," to the neglect of his theory of fine art; and, because of this neglect, they remain "focused on the area of his theory that is no longer of the most pressing contemporary concern" (pp. 2-3).

Crowther seeks to remedy this imbalance by adopting what he describes as "a relatively open exegetical approach … which favours economy in how Kant's broad outlines of argument are interpreted, and the maximization of their potential for solving general problems in aesthetics." In contrast to "interminabilist" approaches, Crowther embraces "a significant level of critique and/or willingness to revise concepts and arguments" offered by Kant (p. 5); makes, in a few places, sustained use of concrete examples; relates Kant's conception of aesthetic judgment in the third Critique to the transcendental deduction of the first; and strives to make Kant's theory, or at any rate the theory that he derives from Kant, applicable not merely to fine art as understood in Kant's time but even to the avant-garde of our own age.

Such is Crowther's program. Certainly his presentation of it is not well calculated to win acceptance. Consider the term "interminabilism." Though the author asserts that it is "not a peevish characterization" (p. 1), it is certainly an invidious one. The coinage of a special "-ism" to describe a certain interpretative approach to Kant's aesthetics implies that interminability is not simply the outcome of that approach but its aim. Crowther gives no argument to support this uncharitable implication, nor does he give any reason to believe that commentary on other areas of Kant's philosophy is any less given to "interminable toings and froings between his texts" than is this particular specialty. Are we supposed to believe that, if only students of Kant's aesthetic theory would put less work into trying to understand it and more into doing philosophical work with it, they would finally do what philosophers have never been able to do, namely to get problems solved and to bring controversy to an end?

Further, Crowther's assertion that recent commentators fail to subject Kant's concepts and arguments to "a proper degree of critical scrutiny and revision" is either question-begging or patently false. What degree of criticism and revision is "proper"? Proper for what purpose? No one who has read the writings of Henry Allison, Hannah Ginsborg, Paul Guyer, or the other commentators on Kant's aesthetics named by Crowther in his opening paragraph (p. 1) could find them to be uncritical in their treatment of their subject. On the contrary, critical evaluation is one of the driving forces of their interpretative arguments. To be sure, it tends to serve as a basis of selection among different possible understandings of Kant's thinking rather than a basis for replacing that thinking, or elements of it, with something putatively better. But that is precisely the difference between trying to understand Kant's aesthetics and simply doing aesthetics, perhaps under the inspiration or guidance of Kant's example. Each enterprise has its place in philosophy. To complain that there has been too much of the one and too little of the other is not unreasonable. But to fault those who do the one for failing to do the other is unfair if not positively confused.

Crowther's execution of his program is hardly more compelling than his statement of it. Take for instance his first chapter, "The Transcendental Deduction: Objective Knowledge and the Unity of Self-Consciousness." After a brief exposition of the argument of the second-edition deduction, the author identifies two supposed "weaknesses" of it: first, it provides no explanation of the specific roles played by the various categories in experience; and second, it rests on "the hugely problematic notion of the ideality of time" (p. 24). By way of remedy, he draws on writings of Gareth Evans and Shaun Gallagher to formulate a way of understanding the relations among self-consciousness, objectivity, and the use of categories that makes it possible to specify the roles of the various categories, or at least structures of experience bearing some analogy to Kantian categories, without the doctrine of the transcendental ideality of time.

It is not clear what one is to make of such an effort. Crowther finds fault with Kant for not providing an account of the roles of the several categories in the "Deduction," but makes no mention of the fact that the subsequent "Analytic of Principles" is devoted to that very topic. He hauls the reader through the dark jungle of Kant's argument only to discard most of its details and to seek illumination in the writings of more recent (and admittedly less obscure) philosophers. His treatment of the text is too casual to deepen our understanding of it, while his treatment of the philosophical problems with which the text is concerned inherits too much of the obscurity of the original to be satisfying in its own right.

The same objection may be made to the remaining chapters of the book, though they offer somewhat more of potential profit to the reader. Chapters 2 and 3 deal with Kant's notoriously murky ideas of the schematism of concepts and the "harmony of imagination and understanding," respectively. Crowther's reconstructions, whatever their limitations, are certainly less murky than the originals. In chapter 4, after examining Kant's attempt at a deduction of judgments of taste and finding fatal defects in it, Crowther proposes a way in which its place can be taken by a consideration of the role of formal comparison in the justification of such judgments. Chapter 5 makes some headway against the obscurity of Kant's use of the notions of "adherent beauty" and "perfection" in his treatment of judgments of taste. Chapter 7 (to skip one for a moment) revisits what the author terms his "austere" reconstruction of Kant's conception of judgments of sublimity, in contrast to the "baroque" approach of the original text.

The most rewarding chapter of the book is surely its sixth, "From Aesthetic Ideas to the Avant-Garde: The Scope of Fine Art." The very idea of applying Kantian aesthetic theory to avant-garde art may seem a hopeless undertaking, as the art that Kant takes as his subject is specifically fine art or beautiful art (in Kant's German, as in the French usage that he follows, there is no verbal distinction here), while beauty simply is not a dominating value, or even always a value at all, for the avant-garde. But, as Crowther shows, Kant's theory is not necessarily confined to this initial definition of subject matter: his notions of originality, exemplariness, and aesthetic ideas have wider application. Crowther subjects each of these concepts to critical examination and modification, but without resorting to drastic renovation. The principal change that he makes is to use the concept of artistic style to fill in Kant's rather schematic account of what constitutes an aesthetic idea. Where Kant says that an aesthetic idea represents a thing of a certain kind with a "completeness" not found in nature, Crowther proposes to understand such completeness as the distinctive way in which the individual artist exercises imagination and selection in his or her treatment of the subject matter. Because the identification of an artist's style requires comparison of his or her work with that of others, identifying aesthetic ideas in works of art requires seeing them in relation to specific artistic traditions or, as Crowther puts it, in terms of a "historical/critical horizon" (p. 154). This modification of Kant's concept of an aesthetic idea elucidates its connection to the concepts of originality and exemplariness and enables Crowther, in the penultimate section of the chapter, to apply it to several examples of avant-garde art (pp. 165-9).

Certainly The Kantian Aesthetic sheds light on some points in Kant's theories of taste and fine art. But do those bits of illumination make it worth the trouble of reading the entire book? Beginning students of Kant's "Critique of the Aesthetic Power of Judgment," especially those not well acquainted with the first Critique, will find the book far too heavily involved in the technical intricacies of Kant's thought to provide much help. Readers already acquainted with the first and third Critiques who wish to deepen their understanding of those texts will find Crowther's engagement with them far too superficial to provide much instruction. Readers who are primarily interested in questions of the nature of art and who come to the book to learn what light Kant's thought sheds on those questions are likely to be repelled not only by the obscurity of the Kantian original but even by the degree of obscurity that lingers on in Crowther's reconstructions. Thus the book succeeds neither as a work of interpretation and commentary nor as an essay in aesthetics.