The Kantian Foundation of Schopenhauer's Pessimism

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Dennis Vanden Auweele, The Kantian Foundation of Schopenhauer's Pessimism, Routledge, 2017, 242pp., $149.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781138744271.

Reviewed by Robert Wicks, The University of Auckland


The title of Dennis Vanden Auweele's book raises one's curiosity. As it tells us that Schopenhauer's pessimism has a Kantian foundation, it intimates that Kant's philosophy itself contains a pessimistic strand. This is unexpected, since pessimism does not appear to be a particularly Kantian quality. Kant's moral theory upholds the belief in individual freedom, the immortality of the soul, and the existence of an all-good, all-knowing, all-powerful God who serves to coordinate happiness with virtue in an ideal end-state. The book reminds us, though, that a pessimistic aspect of Kant resides in a position he maintained in the later part of his career -- one reminiscent of the Christian doctrine of original sin -- that rooted in the human being is a corrupt propensity towards self-interest and evil.

Whether Kant's doctrine of radical evil as stated in Religion Within the Limits of Reason Alone (1793) is consistent with the rest of his philosophy is a controversial matter, but if one accepts it and -- as we see in Schopenhauer -- develops a philosophy that dissolves individual freedom, immortality of the soul, God, and the kingdom of ends, then little moral hope is likely to remain for earth-bound, instinct-driven, human beings. This is one of the book's leading pessimistic affinities between Kant and Schopenhauer. By accentuating the significance of Kant's doctrine of radical evil, Kant and Schopenhauer emerge as kindred spirits.

Upon this interface, Vanden Auweele develops a comprehensive survey of Schopenhauer's philosophy that reviews his epistemology, metaphysics, ethics, religion, aesthetics, and asceticism with an eye towards introducing Kantian themes for comparison, contrast, and further illumination of Schopenhauer's views. The goal is to show that Schopenhauer's philosophy grew out of Kant's, looking back from the 19th century to identify informatively an influx of Kantian themes into Schopenhauer's philosophy.

Schopenhauer's peculiar historical position renders him appropriate for this kind of study: his methodology in The World as Will and Representation (1818) adheres to Aristotelian logic, as does Kant's, and never steps squarely into the early 19th century German idealist style of dialectical reason. This is despite how Schopenhauer's metaphysics -- considering especially how the history of philosophy unfolded through Nietzsche and 20th century existentialist philosophy -- was so far ahead of its time in its non-rational vision of ultimate reality, that it left him as a philosophical loner during the first half of the 19th century.

Vanden Auweele's second entrance into Schopenhauer's pessimism is through the notion of freedom, understood in terms of a conflict between two kinds of freedom -- rationally-grounded and non-rationally-grounded -- that Kant sets forth. These can be understood as contending conceptions of freedom as self-determination. The first is permeated with rationality and has a social orientation: it is where one determines the laws that govern one's activity, as in the application of Kant's categorical imperative, and where one participates in the legislation of the laws of a community or state within which one resides. The second conception is independent of rationality and has an individualistic orientation: it is the mere capacity to will this or that at some time, without any regard to consistency, rules, maxims, regulations, laws, principles, and such. This is an individual person's radical capacity of free choice, the liberum arbitrium indifferentiae, as Schopenhauer calls it, the Willkür, as Kant calls it, and absolute freedom, as Sartre calls it. Vanden Auweele maintains that "Schopenhauer identifies Wille [as in The World as Will [Wille] and Representation] with the Kantian Willkür, which inclines one to apply all characteristics of the Kantian Willkür to the Wille" (p. 108).

There is some insight in this observation. Schopenhauer himself, however, regarded the concept of the liberum arbitrium indifferentiae with hostility, tracing it back to the Book of Genesis and blaming it as the philosophical source for all of his troubles with academia. To follow this book's interpretive route, one must accept that Schopenhauer elevated to the heights of his metaphysics a principle that he abhorred, using it self-consciously as the basis of his conception of Will as thing-in-itself. He states, for example, that "the liberum arbitrium indifferentiae is an invention from the childhood of philosophy that has long since been exploded," that "only ignorance and want of culture could continue to speak about a freedom of a person's individual actions, about a liberum arbitrium indifferentiae" (On the Basis of Morality, §20, §10), and that "it will probably never be possible to convince the masses of the invalidity of this concept, but at least scholars should beware of speaking about it with so much innocence" (On the Freedom of the Will, Section IV, "Predecessors").

It remains that Will as thing-in-itself is non-rational, absolutely self-determining, and acts insofar as it manifests or objectifies itself. Since Will has no consciousness, though, it makes no sense to speak of it as "choosing" anything. Vanden Auweele states nonetheless that "Schopenhauer metaphysicalizes Kant's power of choice and . . . we end up in Schopenhauer with an all-powerful faculty of choice that self-expresses without the normative control and restraint offered by rationality" (p. 113).

Guiding Vanden Auweele's presentation of Schopenhauer's philosophy through a Kantian lens is a Christian perspective. Vanden Auweele states that "I do not believe that Eastern wisdom has a privileged place as a formative influence of Schopenhauer's philosophy" (p. 13). He concludes that "Schopenhauer's philosophy is Protestant Christianity without Christ, God or grace" (p. 224).

The Christian dimensions of Schopenhauer's philosophy are important to highlight -- Schopenhauer tends to have more Christian imagery and thematics in his writings than those from other religions -- but this should not diminish the significance of how immediately after Schopenhauer read sections of the Bhagavadgita in December 1813 and the Upanishads in March 1814 his writings assumed an atheistic tenor, no longer consistent with his earlier self-references in his manuscripts as an "illuminated theist." The time period in question begins with his move to Weimar in November 1813 soon after receiving his PhD in October, and ends with his bitter quarrel and permanent estrangement from his mother in May 1814, at which time he immediately moved to Dresden where in 1815-1817 he lived next to the Sanskrit scholar, Karl Christian Friedrich Krause (1781-1832). In an 1851 letter to Johann Eduard Erdmann, Schopenhauer wrote that during the 1813 winter in Weimar "the orientalist Friedrich Majer introduced me, without solicitation, to Indian antiquity, and this had an essential influence on me."

From the standpoint of Schopenhauer interpretation, perhaps this book's most questionable aspect is its understanding of the culminating point of Schopenhauer's philosophy, namely, ascetic awareness that arises from the denial-of-the-will. Vanden Auweele gives an individual-centered reading of ascetic awareness, stating that the ascetic transcends suffering and becomes absolutely free, with no further significance beyond the individual's liberation. Connections to morality are severed -- "the saint is no longer compassionate and is not motivated to undo other people's suffering because of being completely withdrawn from the world" (p. 218) -- to the point where ascetic consciousness as "the highest good" loses its moral significance, aside from how the individual ascetic no longer suffers. Ascetic awareness "numbs the will to life to sleep" (p. 207) and involves the "narcotic silencing" of the will (p. 142), as if it were mainly an anaesthetic. Vanden Auweele concludes by stating that Schopenhauer's presentation of the ascetic endpoint is "cynical, almost even snide: we ought to distance ourselves from reality and from ourselves to such an extent that there is no reality or self to which to relate" (p. 227).

Another way to understand ascetic awareness -- one where interpretations of the above kind cannot arise -- is to appreciate that the ascetic, like everything else, is a manifestation of Will as the thing-in-itself. When the ascetic denies the will, this amounts to a small reduction in the energy of Will itself, like a sunspot upon the shining sun, the darkness of which represents a cooler area. Unlike the compassionate person, whose field of moral activity is worldly and who helps reduce the suffering of other individuals, the ascetic strikes not at instances of suffering in the spatio-temporal world, but at the ultimate source of suffering, namely, Will itself, working with moral profundity to reduce suffering at its metaphysical root. The ascetic condition is consequently the highest and most hopeful good that a person can achieve as a living being in the hellish spatio-temporal world, for it dissolves the individual self for the sake of quietistically diminishing the morally repulsive energy of Will as thing-in-itself. In Schopenhauer's philosophy, one transforms the spatio-temporal world through the metaphysical repercussions of one's having resigned from it.

In a book that aims to emphasize Kantian influences, the chapter on Schopenhauer's aesthetics stands out for its absence of any extended discussion of the influence of Kant's aesthetics on Schopenhauer's. Aside from suggesting that Kant's theory of genius might have influenced Schopenhauer, there is no summary of the extensive influences that one is led to anticipate, and one is directed to other works to retrieve the Kantian interconnections for oneself: "The reason I do not discuss Schopenhauer's relationship to Kant's aesthetics is that it has already been done extensively" (p. 177). The discussion then proceeds as a general exposition of Schopenhauer's aesthetic theory.

In the midst of this exposition, there is an illuminating reference to the Greek myth of Orpheus, whose music was so enchanting that it brought Ixion's wheel to a stop. For Schopenhauer, aesthetic experience leads us into a transcendent, painless state where, as he states, "the wheel of Ixion stands still" (WWR1, §38). The image of Orpheus confirms that the Greek myths recognize a relationship between aesthetic experience and the reduction of the suffering that arises from unfulfilled desire. The "Schopenhauer-as-Orpheus" theme is not rendered explicit in the book, but it is implicit in the discussion and is there for others to pursue.

The chapter on Schopenhauer's ethics also draws a resonant connection to Schopenhauer's account of the disgusting in art, where it points out that, on a broader level, feelings of disgust are definitive of Schopenhauer's considered moral attitude towards Will as thing-in-itself, since Will is the ultimate reason for the existence of suffering (p. 142). The chapter on Schopenhauer's philosophy of religion contains as well an informative historical observation worth quoting in full:

Kant's talk of rational faith is, in Schopenhauer's view, a "strange hermaphrodite or centaur", or a "kind of Gnostic wisdom" (WWV2 185) . . . Most of the 19th-century idealists did read Kant as such. This reading can be traced back to one Gottlob Christian Storr (1746-1805), who published a number of notes to Kant's first edition of the Religionsschrift, entitled Annotationes quaedam theologiae ad philosophicam Kantii de religione doctrinam (1793). Kant planned a reply to Storr but never explicitly delivered this. Storr was a professor of the famous Tübinger Stift, where he taught Kant's philosophy to, among others, Schelling and Hegel. This might explain the general tendency of reading Kant's Religionsschrift in this way (pp. 165-166).

On the more technical side, Vanden Auweele develops David Hamlyn's partitioning of Schopenhauer's references to knowledge into four groups: (1) knowledge of ordinary spatio-temporal objects [mediate/representational], (2) knowledge of timeless objects, viz., Platonic Ideas [immediate/representational], (3) knowledge of one's body's inner being as Will [mediate/non-representational], (4) knowledge of the inner being of the world as a whole as Will [immediate/non-representational]. This division helps to clarify the content of Schopenhauer's various references to knowledge and is worth keeping in mind whenever working with Schopenhauer's philosophy.

For the most part, Vanden Auweele's exposition is knowledgeable and displays a solid comprehension of Schopenhauer's philosophy. There are occasions, though, where the conceptualizations are confusing. In reference to the ascetic's awareness that leads to salvation and is the highest good, we read that "the in itself of reality [viz., Will] is infinitely removed from human salvation" (p. 225), but also that the non-rationality of the ascetic's awareness "might be a sign that the highest good is a state of being very much in tune with the in itself of reality" (p. 209). In reference to the awareness of the artistic genius, it is said that "the genius is able to appreciate the in itself of reality" (p. 183) and that "the genius perceives the in itself of the object" (p. 183). The "in itself" of "reality" is Will, though, and according to Schopenhauer the artistic genius apprehends not Will directly, but the immediate objectifications of Will, namely Platonic Ideas. The only art that is in direct contact with Will on Schopenhauer's view is music.

This book is valuable in helping us appreciate that there is a strong Christian dimension to Schopenhauer's philosophy. It also builds its argument upon a reliable epistemological framework for understanding Schopenhauer's various conceptions of knowledge. Unlike other presentations of Schopenhauer's philosophy that identify aesthetic, moral, and ascetic awareness as the ascending road to enlightenment, it importantly adds religious awareness into the sequence. On the negative side, we implicitly learn that understanding the historical source of Schopenhauer's notion of the senseless and irrational Will requires us not to rest easy with simply magnifying Kant's conception of Willkür.