The Knowledge Argument

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Sam Coleman (ed.), The Knowledge Argument, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 303pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781316506981.

Reviewed by Donnchadh O'Conaill, Université de Fribourg


If one had all the scientific information about a given subject matter, would one thereby know everything there is to know about it? Frank Jackson's tale of Mary is a vivid illustration of this question: she has an exhaustive scientific understanding of colour vision, but lives in a black-and-white room and has never had a colour experience. On leaving the room and having her first colour experience, would she learn anything new? The knowledge argument depends on an affirmative answer: since she would learn something new, her scientific knowledge would not exhaust everything there was to know about colour vision. In particular, Mary would learn what it would be like to see, e.g., a red object; that is, she would learn about the phenomenal character of colour experiences. This result is claimed by most (though not all) proponents of the knowledge argument to undermine physicalism.[1]

Mary's plight has produced a small mountain of responses, criticisms, defences, etc. (for a recent overview see Nida-Rümelin and O'Conaill 2019). Sam Coleman's volume adds thirteen further chapters to this pile (plus his introduction which itself is a useful review of the debate).

To get the practical matters out of the way: this is probably not the only book about the knowledge argument you should own. The first volume in your library on this topic should still be Ludlow, Nagasawa, and Stoljar's Something About Mary (2004), but if you are interested enough to own that volume, you should invest in this one as well. For the most part, the contributions complement rather than recapitulate earlier work on the knowledge argument (a possible exception is the chapter by Tim Crane, which seemed to cover much the same ground as his 2003 paper "Subjective Facts”). Likewise, for the most part the contributors avoid replying to specific objections (and to specific objections to specific objections . . . ), one exception to this being Torin Alter's chapter on conceptual mastery. They draw on an impressive range of specialist work in other fields, and illustrate the relevance of the knowledge argument across a wide range of topics.

Rather than addressing each chapter, I shall focus on the contributions which struck me as the most interesting and which are also most relevant to the knowledge argument. Some of the strongest chapters, e.g., the contributions by Philip Goff and Robert J. Howell, are less tightly focused on the knowledge argument. Goff's chapter presents an argument against physicalism which is substantively different than the knowledge argument; Howell outlines an intriguing parallel to the knowledge argument, to do with the knowledge that certain systems are or constitute selves. The collection is stronger for including these contributions, but the issues they discuss belong to the background of the knowledge argument rather than being central to on-going debates around it.

One common response to the knowledge argument is that while Mary does acquire new knowledge on leaving the room, this is not because she learns about non-physical properties; rather, on having colour experiences she acquires new concepts and so can think of physical properties in a different way. These new concepts are phenomenal concepts. It is usually thought that one could not have a specific phenomenal concept unless one has had an experience of a specific kind.

David Rosenthal and David Pitt present different arguments against the possibility of phenomenal concepts. Rosenthal argues that for a concept to be a phenomenal concept, the specific experience one has serves as the mode of presentation in virtue of which the concept applies to a phenomenal property or type of experience (36). Therefore, he claims, such a concept cannot apply to the experiences of anyone else: "If they did, one could have phenomenal concepts without having any relevant qualitative experiences, undermining the type of mode of presentation phenomenal concepts are said to have" (37). But this argument arguably involves a type-token confusion. One way to understand how a token experience can serve as a phenomenal concept's mode of presentation is in terms of its being picked out as a sample of a certain kind of entity, e.g., 'an experience of this type', or 'an experience with this phenomenal character'. It is plausible that one cannot designate experiences of this type in this way without undergoing an experience of this type; but equally, phrases such as 'an experience of this type' seem straightforwardly applicable to the experiences of others (as when I feel nauseous and wonder whether my companion is having an experience with the same phenomenal character).

Pitt argues that the very idea of phenomenal concepts involves a confusion about conceptual content. On Pitt's view, conceptual contents are types of experiences, specifically cognitive phenomenal experiences, experiences of consciously thinking (94). Pitt thinks that cognitive phenomenal experiences have a phenomenal character which is distinct from that of experiences of any other type and which individuates and distinguishes them from any other experiences. Therefore conceptual contents cannot be individuated by anything non-(cognitively-)phenomenal (ibid.). This would rule out phenomenal concepts, as Pitt understands them. On his understanding of a would-be phenomenal concept, e.g., the concept 'this pain', its content is supposed to be determined by the specific (non-cognitive) phenomenal property to which it applies, i.e., a property of painfulness (90). On Pitt's view of this concept, its content is actually determined by a completely different phenomenal character (its cognitive-phenomenal character). Therefore, the concept 'this pain' is not a phenomenal concept.

One possible response to Pitt's argument is that the concept 'this pain' works rather like a mental demonstrative, pointing to some specific property to which one must stand in a specific relation (compare with the concept 'this shape', as when one points at a cloud thinking 'This shape is unusual').[2] In thinking of how a demonstrative works, we can distinguish the rule governing its application from what it applies to in a given context. For instance, the rule governing the application of a phenomenal concept might be determined by its own cognitive-phenomenal character, but what it applies to (i.e., its content) might be determined by something external to this phenomenal character (e.g., by a phenomenal property of a different kind, such as a painful property).[3]

As mentioned above, a number of chapters draw on specialist work and specific theories in other fields, e.g., Rosenthal on quality spaces, Goff on grounding, and Amy Kind on imagination. Kind argues that it is not plausible that Mary's new knowledge can be explained as her gaining imaginative abilities on leaving the room. It is generally agreed that it is possible to imagine scenarios in which subjects have experiences which the imaginer has never had. Kind rightly points out that this view of imagining is in tension with the suggestion that Mary could not, while in the room, imagine what it would be like to have colour experiences. (She also discusses in some detail a variant of this claim, that Mary cannot while in the room correctly imagine what it would be like to have colour experiences).

It might be possible to respond to Kind's argument by drawing on a specific view of how we imagine different scenarios, that proposed by Peter Kung (2010). Very briefly, Kung distinguishes between two kinds of content that acts of imagining can contain: qualitative content and assigned content. Qualitative content includes perceptible features and the phenomenal character of experiences one imagines occurring in the imagined scenarios. Assigned contents include propositions which one assumes to hold in the imagined scenario, and which go beyond what one could perceive or experience (for instance, they are what allow us to imagine that Mary in her room knows all the scientific information about colour vision).

Given the distinction between assigned and qualitative contents, we can reformulate the claim about the limits to what Mary can imagine within the room. She can imagine a scenario in which she experiences red, by imagining seeing a ripe apple and assigning the content 'has an experience of seeing red' to herself, but (the suggestion would be) she cannot imagine what it would be like to have such an experience. This is because to imagine what it is like to have an experience of a certain kind requires one to perform an act of imagining with a certain qualitative content (a certain phenomenal character). Mary has never had an experience with a phenomenal character like that of a colour experience, and so she lacks the imaginative resources to build or refine the right sort of qualitative content. Note that this limit to Mary's imaginative abilities is importantly different than other cases Kind discusses where people seem to be able to imagine experiences very different than their own, e.g., what it is like to be autistic, or even to be a cow (175-176). In these cases there would seem to be a greater degree of overlap in the phenomenal character of the experiences had by the imaginers and those had by the subject they are imagining, making it more plausible that with sufficient ingenuity one could imagine having very different experiences of those kinds.

Similar considerations feature heavily in one of the volume's few outright defences of the knowledge argument, by Hedda Hassel Mørch. Specifically, Mørch defends a new version of the argument, the explanatory knowledge argument. Phenomenal knowledge explains some regularities, e.g., people will ceteris absentibus try to avoid pain because of how it feels. This is what Mørch terms an ultimate explanation: it is not inductive, gives rise to no further why-questions, and seems self-explanatory (230-231). To be more precise, if the feeling of pain is causally powerful, it seems inconceivable that it could produce different effects than those it actually produces (232). In contrast, no physical knowledge can ultimately explain regularities. Given this difference between phenomenal and physical knowledge, Mørch argues that phenomenal facts are distinct from physical facts.

One problem with these claims is that Mørch does not provide a detailed discussion of what is involved in conceiving of such scenarios. So, for example, it is not clear why one could not imagine a situation in which a person is in pain and assign the content that this person is thereby disposed to jump for joy. To develop this worry, consider what Mørch says about explanations of regularities which appeal to the natures of physical properties. She argues that such explanations will be analytic (if the property is conceived of dispositionally) or else they will not be ultimate, since if the property is conceived of non-dispositionally, e.g., as the property of having a certain look, it will be conceivable for this property to produce different effects than those it actually does (238). In contrast, "phenomenal knowledge of pain can explain regularities even when pain is conceived of under phenomenal concepts which are neither functional nor dispositional" (ibid.).

But it is not clear that we have a completely non-dispositional phenomenal concept of pain. Mørch glosses the phenomenal character of pain as "intrinsically disagreeable and repulsive" (232). These characterisations can be understood dispositionally (e.g., 'repulsive' as, roughly, 'tending to repulse'). In that case, it may be inconceivable that pain would not produce the effects it actually does; but this threatens to reduce the explanation to an analytic truth (a repulsive property repulses one). It is not clear how these characterisations could be understood entirely non-dispositionally; and if they were understood in this way, it would no longer be clear why it would be inconceivable that such a property could produce different effects.

The final contribution I shall consider is by Tom McClelland, who presents the following dilemma for proponents of the knowledge argument: either phenomenal truths can be deduced from exhaustive physical knowledge, or they cannot. If they can, then the knowledge argument fails. But if they cannot, then there would be no need for the knowledge argument. More precisely, to avoid the first horn of the dilemma one would need to establish that phenomenal truths cannot be deduced from exhaustive physical knowledge; but in establishing this one would have established the conclusion of the knowledge argument before one even considered Mary's situation.

While this is an ingenious argument, McClelland's discussion of the second horn is a little too quick. He suggests that the knowledge argument could be replaced with, for instance, the structural argument against physicalism (190). A key premise of this argument is that there can be no entailment from structural facts (which are the kind of facts the physical sciences reveal) to non-structural facts (including phenomenal facts). But on the face of it, this premise seems just as controversial as anything in the knowledge argument. Furthermore, one way to motivate this premise is precisely by thinking through scenarios such as Mary's. McClelland suggests that this premise can be motivated in other ways; it "might be motivated a priori on the grounds that facts about spatial, temporal and causal relations [i.e., structural facts] can entail only further facts about spatial, temporal and causal relations" (192). But first, this claim is effectively equivalent to the premise it is supposed to motivate; second, while the premise in question might be motivated in this way, it might turn out that it is not possible to do so; third, McClelland provides little detail on how the motivation is supposed to proceed. So it may be that the knowledge argument can play a useful dialectical role regarding the arguments McClelland thinks can replace it.

Space precludes discussing a number of other contributions which merit consideration. Suffice to say that the standard of writing and argument throughout is high, and the volume is a solid and valuable contribution to the Cambridge series Classic Philosophical Arguments.


Crane, T. (2003) 'Subjective Facts', in H. Lillehammer & G. Rodriguez-Pereyra (eds.) Real Metaphysics: Essays in Honour of D. H. Mellor. London: Routledge.

Howell, R. (2007) 'The Knowledge Argument and Objectivity' Philosophical Studies 135 (2): 145-177.

Kaplan, D. (1989) 'Demonstratives', in Almog, J., J. Perry & H. Wettstein (eds.) Themes from Kaplan. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kung, P. (2010) 'Imagining as a Guide to Possibility' Philosophy & Phenomenological Research 81 (3): 620-663.

Ludlow, P., Y. Nagasawa & D. Stoljar (eds.) (2004) There's Something About Mary: Essays on Phenomenal Consciousness and Frank Jackson's Knowledge Argument. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Nida-Rümelin, M. & D. O'Conaill (2019) 'Qualia: The Knowledge Argument', Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2019 edition), E. N. Zalta (ed.

Perry, J. (2001) Knowledge, Possibility and Consciousness. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Stalnaker, R. (2008) Our Knowledge of the Internal World. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

[1] Some proponents of the argument view it not as ruling out physicalism (by showing that there are facts which are not entailed by the physical facts) but as ruling out objectivism, the view that there are no facts which can only be known by having experiences of a certain kind (see Crane 2003; Howell 2007).

[2] For different ways of developing this conception of phenomenal concepts, see Perry 2001; Stalnaker 2008.

[3] The suggestion is that, in David Kaplan's (1989) terminology, phenomenal concepts might have distinct characters and contents, such that their contents might be determined by (non-cognitive) phenomenal properties.