The Language Animal: The Full Shape of the Human Linguistic Capacity

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Charles Taylor, The Language Animal: The Full Shape of the Human Linguistic Capacity, Harvard University Press, 2016, 352pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674660205.

Reviewed by Michael N. Forster, Universität Bonn


This is a rich and important book. Its main topic is the nature of human language. But it also contains several long, semi-digressive, and very interesting discussions of additional topics, including meta-ethics and art (chapter 6). This review will focus on the book's official topic. It will begin by sketching the main contents before going on to offer some critical comments on the historical and philosophical theses developed.

The Preface sets up a fundamental contrast between two conceptions of human language: what Taylor calls 'HHH theories', named after Hamann, Herder, and Humboldt, and what he calls 'HLC theories', named after Hobbes, Locke, and Condillac. Taylor's project is basically to champion the former theories against the latter (ix).

Chapter 1, "Designative and Constitutive Views," explains that what distinguishes these two types of theory is above all that HLC theories are "enframing" theories that "understand language within the framework of a picture of human life, behavior, purposes, or mental functioning, which is itself described and defined without reference to language," whereas HHH theories see language as "constitutive," that is, "as making possible new purposes, new levels of behavior, new meanings" (3-4). Taylor next explores this contrast, focusing mainly on the HHH, "constitutive" side. Here he focuses on Herder's famous idea in his Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772) that what is distinctive of human language, as opposed to animal signs, is Besonnenheit, which Taylor, like Herder, understands as a conception of linguistic "rightness" and which (again like Herder) he sees as distinguishing human beings from animals (6-12). The chapter goes on to discuss and champion various further features of HHH theories and variants of them that Taylor endorses: several forms of linguistic holism (12-25); a broadening of the conception of linguistic "rightness" to include not only designative or descriptive but also non-designative, non-descriptive uses of language (25-9, 47); a thesis of an essential dependence of thought on language (30-1), together with some Wittgensteinian considerations that support it (32-3); a rejection of the assumption common to HLC theories and their (post-)Fregean descendants that description, or furnishing information, is the fundamental function of language (35-6); a recognition of the fundamental role of bodily "enactment," or body-language, in constituting meanings and thereby enabling language proper (38-9); and a distinction between two sorts of disclosure that enactment and linguistic expression make possible: "accessive" (i.e., descriptive) disclosure vs. "existential" disclosure (40-4).

Chapter 2, "How Language Grows," explores how human language develops, both ontogenetically and phylogenetically. Concerning ontogeny, Taylor basically follows Michael Tomasello in arguing (contrary to the epistemology of HLC theories) for a chronological priority of shared intentions over individual subjectivity in child development (52-67). Taylor considers the evidence concerning phylogeny to be less clear, but he tentatively endorses Merlin Donald's suggestion that the development of human language and culture began with a mimetic phase, then passed through a mythic (and ritualistic) phase, before finally attaining a theoretic phase (67-76). One of Taylor's most interesting ideas in this connection concerns how the transition from a mythic(-ritualistic) to a theoretic phase occurred: the latter's distinctions between literal vs. figurative uses of language, the natural vs. the supernatural, myth vs. its underlying meanings, and myth vs. history all had to be created (78).

Chapter 3, "Beyond Information Encoding," argues against the view that human language is continuous in nature with animal signs (84-7). It also argues that the error of seeing them as continuous has encouraged the further mistake of thinking of human language as fundamentally descriptive (86). Finally, it argues (in preparation for a case to be developed more fully in the chapters ahead) that HLC-style theories are fatally flawed because (a) description is not the exclusive function of human language and (b) description presupposes human language's other functions. These other functions include articulating what Taylor calls "human meanings" (e.g., morality); holistic ways of "inhabiting the world" (à la Heidegger); symbolic forms other than language proper but on which language proper depends; the body-language and gesture that are connected to discourse (as opposed to writing); and language's constitution of what Taylor calls "social footings" (90-9).

Chapter 4, "The Hobbes-Locke-Condillac Theory," begins with a sketch of the main lines of the HLC approach (103-10). It then argues that (post-)Fregean philosophy of language to a significant extent continues the HLC approach, and thereby inherits the latter's deficiencies (111-12). In order to make this case, the chapter begins by outlining the main respects in which Frege and his followers by contrast depart from the HLC position (e.g., by introducing anti-psychologism, the primacy of the sentence over the word, and the distinction between sense and reference) (112-16). It then focuses on the residue of continuity: a conception of language as fundamentally descriptive in character, together with an epistemological project of treating language as primarily a tool for acquiring reliable knowledge (116-24). Finally, the chapter argues that while theories of this sort, such as Donald Davidson's, may be able to capture the character of a part of language, they cannot capture the character of language as a whole, and, moreover, the part whose character they can capture is essentially dependent on the parts whose character they cannot. The latter parts are (a) a certain "Cratylist" dimension (which centrally includes figurative or metaphorical uses of language) and (b) "thick" cultural meanings (e.g., moral meanings and ones that constitute social roles and political institutions) (126-8). (Chapter 5 will then go on to discuss case (a) in detail, while Chapters 6 and 7 will go on to do the same for case (b).)

Chapter 5, "The Figuring Dimension of Language," argues that whereas HLC theories hold that figurative uses of language add nothing new to our cognitive access to the world, some such uses in fact do (133-46). The chapter then goes on to discuss several aspects of this. One of these is the fundamental role of embodied engagement with the world in structuring both our vocabulary and our figurative uses of it: human beings tend to acquire words for pragmatically essential discriminations first (e.g. "dog"), those for less pragmatically important ones only later (e.g., "mammal" or "dachshund"); and they also tend to develop figurative extensions of the meanings of prepositions (e.g. from "over" in the sense of being above to "over" in the sense of being beyond) in a way that is guided by practical activity (in order to get to a point "over" the bridge in the latter sense we need to do so by first passing "over" it in the former sense) (146-56). Another aspect is the role in structuring our language and cognition of what Taylor, following Mark Johnson and George Lakoff, calls "template" metaphors (i.e., very fundamental and widely applied metaphors such as "in" and "out") (156-64). A third aspect is a certain "symbolic" use of language, as, for example, when in the moral domain we speak of people as "upright" or employ the concept of a moral "stain" (164-9). Taylor argues that the essential role of such figurative uses of language within language cannot be accounted for by HLC theories and their (post-)Fregean descendants, such as Davidson's truth-conditional theory, so that such theories fail as accounts of our grasp of language (170-2).

Chapter 6, "Constitution 1," argues that feelings are internal to our understanding of many terms, including moral terms (180-7), and that language is essential to the constitution of both of these as well, which is something that HLC theories, with their focus on the descriptive function of language, cannot account for (187-90). This character of the moral sphere does not preclude the existence of better and worse views within it, however (193-223; cf. 339-40). In this area bodily enactment, sensuous and linguistic articulation, and, finally, explanation all play important roles, forming a sort of hierarchy of levels (223-4). But, in addition, there is also the sort of non-assertive "portrayal" that is characteristic of the arts, such as music and painting (235-7). In particular, music often expresses and creates new human meanings and experiences (242-6), even while remaining "ontically indefinite" (248). So this sort of portrayal needs to be included in the aforementioned hierarchy as well (see for this 250-2; though there seems to be some confusion in Taylor's characterization of the finally resulting hierarchy here, and later on also some wobbling concerning whether or not artistic "portrayal" is really as essential as its inclusion here implies (334)). In the domain of "human meanings," language proper therefore requires a whole range of symbolic forms, including bodily enactment and the "portrayal" of art, which contradicts the HLC assumption that it can occur without these (260). Moreover, this also applies to language tout court, since scientific meanings are only possible in the context of a background of "human meanings" (262). The facts that figurative uses of language are fundamental to language (chapter 5) and that the "human meanings" that are fundamental to all language presuppose enactment and artistic "portrayal" (chapter 6) defeat HLC theories and their (post-)Fregean descendants, which conceive language as fundamentally descriptive (262).

Chapter 7, "Constitution 2," completes this case against such theories by adding that, like "human meanings," "social footings" (such as engaging with someone in an avuncular manner), social orders, and political institutions are also constituted and transformed through discourse -- as, for example, when notions of "equality" entered ancient Greek political life or notions of "identity" enter modern political debates in connection with such issues as homosexual rights (280-4). As in the case of "human meanings," this challenges HLC theories and their descendants, which focus exclusively on the descriptive function of language (285-7). A similar point applies to ritual as well (288).

The remaining chapters complement the fundamental case that has been developed up to this point with what Taylor calls "Further Applications." Chapter 8, "How Narrative Makes Meaning," argues that in order to understand the moral of a novel, the current condition of a person, or the present nature of a society one needs to know the diachronic narrative that led up to it (309-17). It also argues that doing this in an autobiographical mode is an essential part of what it is to be a self (317-18).

Chapter 9, "The Sapir-Whorf Hypothesis," considers Sapir and Whorf's famous hypothesis that different languages (especially in virtue of their different grammars) constitute different worldviews. Taylor basically argues that where everyday descriptive language is concerned, for example, different ways of using count nouns vs. mass nouns, or different vocabularies for colors, this hypothesis is not plausible (322-4); that on a more "metaphysical" plane, for example, in relation to different ways of conceiving time, it is indeed plausible, but this does not matter very much because our own positions in this area are clearly superior to the rival ones (325-7); and that the domain where the hypothesis applies most clearly and importantly is that of cultural differences, that is, the domain of the sorts of "human," in particular moral, meanings, "social footings," social orders, and political institutions that Taylor has discussed in Chapters 6 and 7 (327-8). The chapter concludes by appending a (perhaps less important) discussion of differences in linguistic "register" (329-31).

Finally, the "Conclusion: The Range of Human Linguistic Capacity" summarizes the book's overall case (332-4). It also adds some further reflections concerning the differences between human beings and (other) animals: in particular, concerning joint attention, play, and the sort of flexibility (in the sense of freedom from narrow instinct) that language allows human beings unlike animals (Taylor again takes over the last of these features, flexibility, from Herder's Treatise on the Origin of Language) (334-42). Lastly, the chapter points out that the HHH theory of language led historically to certain views of the significance of poetry and ritual among the German Romantics that Taylor proposes to take up and develop further in a companion volume (342-5).

This is an extraordinarily rich and rewarding book, the product not only of a lifetime of deep thinking and writing about the issues involved, but also of an admirable attempt to take the current state of research into account (many of the works that Taylor cites and draws on only appeared during the last decade or so). The present reviewer is very much in sympathy with many of the book's arguments: especially, with its thesis of the superiority of the Hamann-Herder-Humboldt tradition. However, I also find a number of the book's positions concerning both historical and philosophical matters problematic, and would therefore now like to discuss a number of these.

Let us begin with some historical questions. Taylor is a real expert on the history of German philosophy, and to a certain extent also the history of philosophy more broadly. He always works with the primary texts in the original languages and forms his own judgments rather than just picking up interpretations from the secondary literature (as so often happens). Accordingly, his remarks on the history of philosophy, especially those on the German HHH tradition, are for the most part both reliable and illuminating. Nonetheless, there are a number of weaknesses in this whole area.

One concerns the book's conception of its main opponent: the HLC tradition together with its alleged (post-)Fregean continuers. For while there are indeed some very striking continuities between the positions of Hobbes, Locke, and Condillac themselves (as well as Hume, incidentally, who is strangely missing from Taylor's account), it is much less clear that (post-)Fregean philosophy of language should be seen as continuing their project. It is quite true that the two sides share a certain epistemological focus, a conception of the core of language as descriptive, and a concern to make language a reliable tool for the acquisition of scientific knowledge (116-24.). Pointing this out seems to me one of the main achievements of Taylor's book. But besides the several important (post-)Fregean departures from the HLC tradition that Taylor himself lists (112-16), there are also several further ones. In particular, Frege himself (albeit only equivocally) and then successors such as Davidson (unequivocally) take on board one of the central ideas of the HHH tradition: that language is constitutive of thought (i.e., that without language there cannot be thought). And Frege, followed by most post-Fregean philosophy of language, emphatically rejects the sort of equation of meanings with subjective mental "ideas" that constituted the central thesis of the HLC tradition (this is a second sort of anti-"psychologism" in Frege that is quite distinct from the sort of anti-"psychologism" concerning the status of logical laws that Taylor himself rightly attributes to him (112)). Taylor's attempt to force all of the theories that he dislikes into one Procrustean bed results in various further interpretive mutilations as well. For example, he argues that the project of seeing human language as continuous with animal signs "encourages the concentration on description, or alternatively on coding information as the main function of language" (86), whereas in fact animal signs have traditionally been seen as precisely not usually descriptive or information-encoding (which is why the recent discovery by Dorothy Cheney and Robert Seyfarth that vervet monkeys do use signs to convey information was so revolutionary).

This sort of problem is slightly less severe in connection with the HHH tradition and its descendants, since the thinkers involved there -- Hamann, Herder, Humboldt, and then the Romantics -- really do share a lot of common ground. Nonetheless, here too Taylor's historical account has certain deficiencies, especially concerning "Herder, who has been my inspiration throughout" (342). One problem is that Taylor gives only an extremely incomplete picture of the achievements of Herder and his tradition in the philosophy of language. For example, while Taylor does recognize that they championed a thesis that language is constitutive of thought (30-1), he leaves the exact import of this thesis vague and then jumps to Wittgenstein for arguments in its support (32-3).  But Herder had articulated an unusually precise and, moreover, plausible version of the thesis, namely that thought is essentially dependent on and bounded in its scope by language (i.e., that someone can only think if s/he has a language and can only think what s/he is able to express linguistically).  He had also developed serious arguments in support of the thesis, including one that is arguably more compelling than any to be found in successors such as Wittgenstein.  Moreover, he defended the thesis convincingly against important prima facie counterexamples (e.g., the seeming occurrence of thought without language in certain animals and the seeming ability of other expressive media than language, such as instrumental music, sculpture, and painting, to express thoughts without language). Another omission: Herder not only developed the thesis just mentioned but also a second closely related one that Taylor entirely overlooks: that meanings consist not in designated objects, Platonic forms, subjective mental "ideas," or whatnot, as much of the philosophical tradition had held, but in the use of words. (This second thesis is another case in which Herder strikingly anticipates Wittgenstein. It also constitutes the core of the especially cogent argument for the first thesis that I alluded to above.)

Taylor overlooks another set of important contributions that Herder made to the philosophy of language. Taylor himself rightly points out the great importance for the philosophy of language of a sensitive "hermeneutics," a hermeneutics that, for example, acknowledges and accepts the so-called "hermeneutical circle." (Taylor should have added here that this is something that the HLC tradition and its (post-)Fregean descendants have strikingly failed to provide.) Taylor attributes this achievement to Heidegger, Gadamer, and Ricoeur (216-19). However, it was in fact Herder -- followed by the Romantic philosopher Schleiermacher – who first developed a sensitive hermeneutics of the sort in question, including an acknowledgment and acceptance of the hermeneutical circle.  Herder did this on the basis of his philosophy of language and his recognition of historicism, in the sense of the phenomenon of deep divergences in concepts, beliefs, values, types of feelings, and so on between different historical periods and different cultures (a recognition that Friedrich Meinecke correctly credits him with in his well-known book on the subject). By contrast, Heidegger and Gadamer's hermeneutics in part merely borrows from Herder and Schleiermacher's and in part perverts it.

Taylor also ignores the fact that Herder -- again followed by Schleiermacher -- was the first to develop a radical new theory and methodology of translation, namely, what would today be called a "foreignizing" (as opposed to "domesticating") theory.  This theory, besides having exercised an enormous beneficial impact on the practice of translation in Germany, continues to constitute the core of the most important translation theories/methodologies developed in recent decades (e.g., those of Antoine Berman and Lawrence Venuti).

One final example of Taylor's omissions here: Among the most central and interesting parts of Taylor's own argument against HLC theories is his thesis in Chapter 5 that figurative uses of language are fundamental to language as a whole. In this connection, he cites much contemporary literature, such as the work of Mark Johnson and George Lakoff. However, this is yet another area in which Herder had in fact already shown the way, especially in the essay On Image, Poetry, and Fable (1787) and in his Metacritique. Indeed, there was a whole early tradition of such theories that Taylor fails to mention in which Herder constituted a central link: a tradition that already began before him with Condillac (a fact that, incidentally, again complicates Taylor's sharp HHH vs. HLC opposition) and which then continued after him with Nietzsche (especially in On Truth and Lie in an Extra-Moral Sense).

Finally, the historical dimension of Taylor's account is also handicapped by a one-sided picture of Herder that focuses almost exclusively on a single text from a single phase of his career, the Treatise on the Origin of Language (1772).  Taylor neglects other highly relevant texts (e.g., besides those already mentioned above, the Fragments on Recent German Literature (1767-8), This Too a Philosophy of History for the Formation of Humanity (1774), On the Cognition and Sensation of the Human Soul (1778), and Ideas for a Philosophy of History of Humanity (1784-91)).  He also neglects changes/developments in Herder's position. For example, whereas the version of the thesis of thought's essential dependence on language that is found in the Treatise is on closer inspection merely verbal, consistent in substance with a sharp dualism of thought vs. language in the manner of the Enlightenment, other texts from both before and after the Treatise develop a genuine, radical, and philosophically superior version of the thesis. Whereas the Treatise retains an atomistic view of language in the manner of the Enlightenment and has only a very confused conception of the nature of grammar, the later Ideas sees language-use as always presupposing a grammar and as to this extent holistic, eliminates the earlier confusions concerning grammar, and, in addition, argues that grammars vary deeply between languages (a position that would later give birth to modern linguistics in Friedrich Schlegel and Humboldt -- which, incidentally, is yet another example of an achievement of Herder's in the philosophy of language that Taylor ignores). Finally, whereas the Treatise argues for a sharp difference between human language and animal signs, and a corresponding sharp difference between humans and animals themselves, the Ideas rather argues for continuity between the two sides. (Readers who are interested in pursuing any of these issues might consult my After Herder: Philosophy of Language in the German Tradition (OUP, 2010) and German Philosophy of Language: From Schlegel to Hegel and Beyond (OUP, 2011), where they are all discussed in some detail.)

Let us now turn to consider some aspects of Taylor's philosophical argument. A first problem is that there is a vacillation in his conception of the main target against which he is arguing. Is it, as his opening distinction between "enframing" and "constitutive" theories implies, the position that thought and meaning, together with whatever psychological states and psychologically laden practice ("purposes" and "behavior") presuppose them, are essentially independent of language? Or is it rather, as much of the book implies, that language is fundamentally designative and descriptive (and that the philosophy of language should strive to facilitate accurate description)? These positions are logically independent of each other: an "enframer" could without any contradiction either be such a descriptivist or not; such a descriptivist could without any contradiction either be an "enframer" or not. Of course, there is nothing wrong with attacking several logically independent targets in one book, but the failure to distinguish between these two clearly tends to both obscure and weaken Taylor's case.

A second problem is that there is a deep tension between Taylor's central thesis, taken from Herder, that what is distinctive of human language (as opposed to animal signs) is a sense of linguistic "rightness," on the one hand, and Taylor's rejection of descriptivism, on the other hand. In fairness to Taylor, it is true that he broadens the relevant notion of linguistic "rightness" to include non-descriptive cases, so there is no flat contradiction here. But in Herder descriptive cases were precisely the ones in question. Moreover, it seems difficult to avoid treating them as at least the paradigm cases of linguistic "rightness," which would arguably be enough to give a descriptivist all he really needs.

A third problem concerns the deep role of figurative uses of language in constituting language as a whole for which Taylor argues very effectively and interestingly in Chapter 5. This role is indeed incompatible with a widespread perception in the HLC tradition and its aftermath in (post-)Fregean philosophy of language that such uses are merely secondary, superficial, and even pernicious. But it does not seem to be in principle incompatible with either of Taylor's main targets from that tradition: the "enframing" view of language and the descriptivist view of language. After all, metaphors could be seen as fundamentally just a certain kind of thoughts, so there seems to be no tension here with an "enframing" position; and both metaphors and the features that they serve to illuminate are normally descriptive in character, so there seems to be no tension with a descriptivist position either.

A fourth problem concerns the other main pillar of Taylor's case: his argument in Chapters 6 and 7 that language is constitutive of "human meanings" such as moral values, "social footings," social orders, political institutions, and the like. The problem here lies in a certain one-sidedness of the argument. The standard position in the HHH tradition was that all thought and meaning essentially depend on language. If that were plausible, then one would think that would be the position Taylor should mainly focus on, his "human meanings," "social footings," and so on being merely a sort of special case of language's much broader constitutive function. However, Taylor seems not to see things this way. While he does consider the standard position in question sympathetically, his discussion of it is strangely brief and thin (30-3), and he implies that the sort of constitutive function that language has in "human meanings," "social footings," and so forth is not to be found in other areas, such as the description of natural objects (though he also implies in some rather obscure remarks that it is involved there indirectly due to a certain dependence of the latter uses of language on the former ones (262)). This all seems to amount to a sort of side-stepping of the central issue in the "enframing" vs. "constitutive" debate.

Why does Taylor side-step it in this way? As far as I can see, he does not tell us, but two possible reasons can be extracted from his book -- although, unfortunately, neither turns out to be adequate in the end. A first possible reason concerns a certain ambiguity in the conception of a "constitutive" theory of language: Constitutive of thoughts and meanings? Or constitutive of those and thereby also of the phenomena with which they are concerned? To the extent that Taylor was thinking of the latter meaning of "constitutive" (perhaps encouraged to do so by the failure to distinguish clearly between the issues of "enframing" vs. designation/description discussed above), this would give him a reason for seeing "human meanings," "social footings," and so on as cases in which a constitutive theory applies but for seeing natural objects as cases in which it does not, since it is plausible to think that language is essentially involved in the constitution of such things as moral badness, democracy, and so forth, but not that it is essentially involved in the constitution of, say, the solar system. But then the former sort of "constitutive" theory (which is what Taylor's opening characterization of a "constitutive" theory rather suggested) still seems to be extremely important as well, so that his relative neglect of it remains unsatisfactory.

A second possible reason lies in the sort of alleged asymmetry between everyday descriptions of nature (using count nouns, mass nouns, color terms, and so on) together with more "metaphysical" descriptions vs. cultural meanings that Taylor argues for when discussing the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis in Chapter 9. His core idea here is that whereas different languages may constitute very different cultural meanings, nature constrains us all to more or less the same concepts for everyday descriptions. But this is again an inadequate reason. For one thing, such constraint would not, strictly speaking, be incompatible with language playing an essential constitutive role in the concepts in question. For another, the idea of such an asymmetry -- notwithstanding its anticipation by one member of the HHH tradition (not Herder, but Schleiermacher in his famous essay on translation) and its popularity in contemporary Anglophone philosophy -- is mistaken. Consider, for example, the case of color conceptualization that Taylor himself cites. As I have shown elsewhere, the central empirical research done by the soi-disant "anthropologists" Brent Berlin and Paul Kay that purports to discover massive conceptual common ground concerning colors across all peoples is a house built on sand. In particular, it depends on an unholy combination of conceptual confusion (e.g., the assumption that if two color terms share the same paradigm cases, they must connote the same concept, even if their extensions are strikingly different) and empirical errors (e.g., false interpretations of Homeric color vocabulary -- a central case, since it was this case that originally sparked the whole debate about color conceptualization in the nineteenth century -- that no competent classical philologist would even take seriously, let alone accept). Or to mention a different sort of example that undermines Taylor's position: while it is no doubt true that salient features of nature tend to be referred to by virtually all languages (as Taylor argues), as Frege has taught us, reference and sense (or concept) are quite different matters. For instance, while the Greeks with their word "Helios" and we with our word "sun" indeed refer to the same object, the concepts involved are radically different (e.g., their concept implies a sort of (divine) personhood, intelligence, purposiveness, performance of actions, etc., whereas ours definitely does not).

A fifth problem concerns the two closely related questions of whether human language and animal signs are similar or dissimilar (or in Taylor's vocabulary: "continuous" or not) and whether human beings and animals themselves are similar or dissimilar. Taylor's position here is problematic in a number of ways. For one thing, these questions, when posed in the naïve form in which he poses them, are extremely unclear, indeed, hardly more than pseudo-questions (a little like the question 'How long is a piece of string?'). For another thing, his ground for giving the answer "dissimilar" to the first question, namely that only human beings have a sense of linguistic "rightness," whereas animals are merely conditioned, is very dubious empirically (as that acute observer of animal behavior, Darwin, already noted in The Descent of Man, and as the more recent research of Irene Pepperberg has confirmed, even parrots do not merely "parrot"). For yet another thing, Taylor's answer to the second question is flatly inconsistent: whereas his book bears the title The Language Animal, at one point he describes taking a human for an animal as nothing less than a "category mistake" (139). For yet a fourth thing, in building a case in support of the latter sort of answer (which is the one that he usually seems to favor) by citing a set of characteristics that he thinks distinguish human beings from all (other) animals -- including, besides the sense of linguistic "rightness," also joint attention, culture, and flexibility (in the sense of a certain freedom from instinct) -- he seems not to notice the following sorts of problems that would arise even if the choice of this set were warranted. (a) It will presumably be possible to do something similar to this for any animal species in comparison with all the others. (b) Any temptation to exalt these particular characteristics over the ones that work for the other species stands under justified suspicion of being merely speciocentric (if cheetahs were able to reflect and talk, one could imagine them saying, "Linguistic 'rightness,' joint attention, culture, and flexibility hooey! Being the fastest mammal, that's where it's really at, man!"). (c) Even the attempt to justify such an exalting to a modest extent by appealing to more fundamental values which do not necessarily claim to be more than human runs into the difficulty that it is actually very unclear whether the characteristics in question make a net positive rather than a net negative contribution to the realization of the values in question: knowledge-acquisition? (but don't forget that these characteristics also generate human beings' massive susceptibility to cognitive illusions, for example geocentrism, a belief in the objectivity of secondary qualities, and the fantasies of myth and religion); morality? (but don't forget that these characteristics also generate human beings' pervasive propensity for lying, deceiving, torturing, waging war, and committing genocide); evolutionary fitness? (but don't forget that these characteristics also generate the very real possibility, or even likelihood, that human beings will one day achieve the unprecedented evolutionary own goal of being the first species to go the way of the dinosaurs through its own voluntary activities (e.g., the development of nuclear weapons) and in full awareness of the risk that they entailed). Finally, Taylor also seems to overlook the fact that answers to the two questions at issue of the sort that he favors are likely to be deeply ideological in character, that is, not only confused or false but also, thereby, supportive of the selfish interests of human beings against those of other animals (through furnishing rationalizations for our quantitatively massive and qualitatively appalling exploitation of, and cruelty towards, them) and, moreover, attractive to human beings mainly because they are so. (An apt footnote on p. 145 concerning the injustice to wolves involved in Hobbes's dictum homo homini lupus (man is a wolf to man) suggests that Taylor might himself not be incorrigibly closed to this sort of worry if it were pointed out to him.)

A sixth problem concerns Taylor's tendency to be too concessive toward some of the modern theories in the philosophy of language that he criticizes, such as Chomsky's and Davidson's. For example, he suggests at one point that Davidson's theory may adequately capture one part of language, though not all of it (126-8), whereas in fact the theory seems open to fatal objections. One such objection is that whereas its model of radical interpretation may seem plausible in application to someone who already has a first language and then sets about interpreting a second one, it seems patently absurd when applied to a key case of radical interpretation that we all actually experience at one time in our lives: that of acquiring a first language. And Davidson's strong version of linguistic holism entails a position of the sort that he eventually himself makes explicit and endorses in "A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs," namely, that there are no such things as chronologically stable or intersubjectively shared meanings but only "passing theories of meaning" -- a conclusion that Davidson himself apparently considers tenable and interesting but which is far more plausibly taken as a reduction of his theory to absurdity. (Incidentally, Taylor's own enthusiasm for the linguistic holism that he finds in the HHH tradition shows no awareness that strong versions of it, such as Davidson's, run into this sort of problem.)

Notwithstanding these arguable historical and philosophical weaknesses, Taylor's book is a richly informative and admirable attempt to delineate "the full shape of the human linguistic capacity" (as its subtitle has it). More than that, it affords a model of what it is to be a genuine philosopher: at an age when most philosophers have either given up altogether or else fallen into dogmatically repeating views that they have long since held, Taylor continues an open-minded search for the right answers, drawing not only on the older literature from philosophy and several other disciplines that he has long since mastered but also on a wealth of newer literature from an equally wide range of sources.