The Language of Liberal Constitutionalism

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Howard Schweber, The Language of Liberal Constitutionalism, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 386pp., $96.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521861328.

Reviewed by Brian Bix, University of Minnesota


Howard Schweber's book, The Language of Liberal Constitutionalism, sets itself the difficult task of responding to all the basic issues of constitutionalism, while offering a novel approach, one that focuses on language.

Those who study constitutional law and constitutional theory know what to expect from books in their field:  they tend to be either heavily "doctrinal" discussions of rules, principles, and case decisions within a single legal system; theoretical or policy arguments for or against the legitimacy of judicial review of legislative action; or critical revisions of the great historical political theorists of limited government.  The Language of Liberal Constitutionalism does not fit comfortably into any of these categories, even if it partakes of both the second (legitimacy of judicial review) and the third (history of political ideas).  For most legal theorists and political theorists, it will be a book unlike any they have seen before:  an effort to mix philosophy of language, political theory, legal theory, and constitutional law.

It is a refreshingly different constitutional law book in another way.  Most books, even those offering grand theories of one nation's constitution, or theories of constitutionalism in general, have clear policy preferences regarding what values are protected by a particular constitutional text, properly interpreted, or what interests should be protected by all constitutions.  And it is hard for readers of such books not to suspect that the theoretical assertions are driven in large part by the policy conclusions the author wishes to justify.  Schweber's text generally -- and intentionally (328) -- avoids getting mired in particular constitutional law disputes of this sort.

(There are two small exceptions, late in the text, where Schweber does enter the fray, though not in the traditional way of arguing for or against particular hot-button positions -- e.g., like the constitutionality of restricting abortion.  The first example is Schweber's argument that his approach to constitutional discourse would exclude a constitutional system that delegated constitutional decision-making to religious leaders or other non-governmental officials or experts. (335-340)  The analysis is that delegation at that level would inevitably lead to two inconsistent systems of constitutional language, contrary to the unitary nature of sovereignty.  Secondly, Schweber rejects emergency suspensions or modifications of constitutional norms that are not themselves justified by the constitutional text; for Schweber, this would be illegitimate usurpation. (341-342))

When most constitutional law scholars think about constitutional theory and language, they consider arguments about how the terms of the United States Constitution (or some other constitution) should be interpreted:  according to the Framers' original understanding, according to the Framers' views about application, according to the accepted meaning in the general population at the time of ratification, according to changing or modern understandings, etc.  Schweber is making a different sort of point:  that the sort of language one uses in arguing within and about a constitutional provision is, or at least should be, different from the sort of language one uses in other sorts of political, moral, or legal debate.  To put the point a different way (and in the way Schweber usually couches the claim), constitutions limit the language in which claims can be made; constitutional language is "exclusive."

The idea of democratic decision-making constrained by constitutional terms has become pervasive in modern governance, but its popularity has not erased the deep questions of legitimacy that such constraints raise.  Standard questions and criticisms include:  why should we (the current generation) be bound by choices made by constitutional authors of past generations?  and, if democratic self-rule is the legitimate form of government, what can justify restrictions on (current) democratic majorities?

As Schweber points out, the most attractive paths to justifying constitutional structures are (1) universal consent (for the constitutional structure) and (2) moral certainty (for the substantive values protected by the constitution).  However, neither is likely in the country (or the world) in which we live, in which the reality is one of significant and irresolvable value pluralism.  How could considerations of language help to justify constraining democratic self-rule by constitutional terms, or justify having these constraints bind later generations?  For Schweber, "a legitimate constitutional regime can be grounded in the … commitment to a constitutional language, and … the moment of that linguistic commitment is the first moment of sovereignty by consent." (191)  Schweber argues that

a legitimate constitutional regime depends on the existence of a self-sovereign People capable of constitutional consent.  The capacity for constitutional consent, in turn, requires a prior, unanimous, 'as if' consent to the construction of a constitutional language, and the subsequent promulgation of the constitutional text creates the exemplar of that constitutional language. (193-194)

He continues:

In response to the further question of how the initial commitment to the creation of constitutional language can be conceived of as binding over time, the answer is that in light of the reconception of self-sovereignty as a description of discursive capacity, precommitment to a system of constitutional language is an analytically necessary element of continuing democratic self-rule. (194)

One can see how Schweber follows those political theorists who resist an anthropomorphic view of sovereignty.  In this work, "'sovereignty' names a set of discursive conditions that make self-rule meaningful." (320)  And the self-sovereignty is exercised through the commitment to "constitutional language."

For Schweber, constitutional language both plays an important theoretical role in justifying the system of governance and has an important function in the on-going constitutional process.  On one side, Schweber points out that for a text to work as a constitution, there must be rules regarding the terminology in which moral and political claims are made regarding the basic political structures:  such claims must be translated into constitutional language, a translation that will inevitably exclude certain forms of argument and make other arguments harder to make.  On the other side, it is the consent to this constitutional language that is the act of unanimous consent -- an "as if" consent -- that both grounds the legitimacy of the constitutional system and defines the sovereignty of the people creating and maintaining the system.  (Schweber traces the idea of consent to constitutional language to Locke. (45-80))  The consent is "as if" consent in that "a demonstrated willingness to employ constitutional language, even in the absence of a specific subjective mental state of approval of its form or content, indicates consent sufficient to establish the legitimacy of the creation of that language." (115)

As noted, constitutional language, by its nature, excludes; arguments for the structures of governance, and the basic rights individuals have against the state, must be couched in the terms set by the constitution.  Where such claims are made in the straightforward terminology of morality or religion, or even conventional legal language, without translation into constitutional language, the arguments will be illegitimate. (328-330)  At the same time, while constitutional language must exclude, it cannot exclude too much, or determine too much normatively, as this would undermine democratic legitimacy.  In this sense, Schweber argues that constitutional language needs to be not only exclusive, but also "incomplete."

Other constitutional commentators -- e.g., Philip Bobbitt -- have emphasized the autonomy of constitutional language and argumentation, and have similarly tied the legitimacy (both of the system in general and particular types arguments) to the discourse, but Schweber's theory is far more elaborate and extensive, connecting constitutional discourse to issues regarding sovereignty, on one hand, and questions of authority and deliberative democracy, on the other.  Schweber also finds ways to get bits and pieces from a wide range of political, legal and moral theories, to build the argument he needs.  Towards that purpose, the text includes close readings of classical writers, such as Jean Bodin, A. B. Dicey, John Locke, and James Wilson, but also quicker summaries of a wide range of contemporary writers, including Joshua Cohen, Ronald Dworkin, Christopher Eisgruber, Jon Elster, Jürgen Habermas, H. L. A. Hart, Hans Kelsen, Frank Michelman, John Rawls, Joseph Raz, Cass Sunstein, Jeremy Waldron, and Keith Whittington, just to give a fraction of the list of writers to whom at least a few pages are devoted.  If my experience with the legal theorists discussed is representative, there is likely room to quibble with some of Schweber's readings, but this is largely beside the point.  The book is valuable not as an introduction to what other books say, but as a novel approach to thinking about constitutions and constitutionalism.

The ultimate question is whether the new fulcrum Schweber has offered is sufficient to hold all the moral and political weight that is placed upon it.  A "continuing unanimous 'as if' consent to employ constitutional language" (321) seems not much sturdier than the analogous "tacit consent" to governance that most commentators have judged to have held up poorly in Locke's work, and yet that "'as if' consent" must answer the weighty problems of value pluralism and the binding force on future actors.  One might reasonably doubt that it can hold up to the task.  However, whatever the lingering doubts, The Language of Liberal Constitutionalism remains a provocative and novel effort to resolve the myriad moral and political doubts at the foundation of constitutionalism.