The Language of Thought: A New Philosophical Direction

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Susan Schneider, The Language of Thought: A New Philosophical Direction, MIT Press, 2011, 259pp., $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015578.

Reviewed by Georges Rey, University of Maryland, College Park


The language of thought hypothesis (LOTH) and computational theory of mind (CTM) have attracted considerable attention since the seminal work of Harman (1973), Fodor (1975), and many others in psychology and artificial intelligence. Susan Schneider is concerned to defend these claims against several difficulties with which she thinks they have been needlessly burdened:

  1. Fodor's (2000) argument that "the cognitive mind is non-computational . . . employ[ing] a view in which cognitive processing is entirely sequential, and in which the biological underpinings of cognition are ignored" (pp. 1-2).
  2. The LOTH's "conceptual cornerstone -- the very notion of a symbol -- is poorly understood" (p. x).
  3. The LOTH's "atomistic theory of meaning conflicts with its theory of compu­tation [and] . . . is too emaciated -- too non-psychological -- to be a satisfactory theory of concepts" (p. x).

She begins by first addressing (chs. 2-3) what she takes to be the threat to the LOTH raised by (1), arguing that Fodor's arguments against the adequacy of CTM are defective, and that the parallel processing of "global workspace" models (pp. 43ff), and "long-distance axons . . . enabling the manipulation of information across . . . modules" (p. 57) will substantially reduce the problems of relevance and globality that worry Fodor. She then proceeds to try to resolve issues (2) and (3) by appeal to a "total computational role" view of the individuation of symbols (chs. 4-5). This permits a "prag­matic atomism," whereby symbols are individuated by these total roles, but have broad content by virtue of their relations to their referents (chs. 6-7). She argues that this combination will resolve the problems that standard "Frege cases" of co-extensive expressions pose for an atomistic theory like Fodor's (ch. 8). In this short review I'll discuss mostly (2) and (3), ending with only brief comments about (1).

The "Standard View"

Schneider repeatedly identifies her target to be what she calls "standard" LOTH views, and what their proponents "generally" believe (pp. 3, 15, 159, 160, 171, 180, 230-2). However, the specific views she criticizes are almost entirely confined to Fodor. Many of us who have been defending versions of the LOTH for quite a while now -- e.g., Harman (1973), Block (1986), Carruthers (1996, 2006), Devitt (1996), and Rey (1997, 2009) -- empha­tic­ally reject Fodor's semantic atomism, and either deny or are agnostic about his claims about the limits of computation. In any case, Schneider cites no one who agrees with Fodor about these latter issues, and so her book has to be taken as largely a polemic against merely his idiosyncratic views of them.

As a critique of Fodor, however, Schneider's book doesn't consider many of the extensive and imagin­ative defenses he has provided of his views, and she sometimes burdens him with problems not suggested by anything he claims, of, e.g., homunculi (pp. 50-3), a supposed exclusion of concepts from any role in psychology (p. 159), and a commitment to serial processing (pp. 4, 11, 45; pace p. 45 fn. 10, there is no such commitment at Fodor 2000:p. 31).

The "conflict" of her problem (3) is a particularly puzzling case in point. She rightly notes (pp. 3-4, ch. 8) that Fodor's views have problems with certain sorts of Frege cases, especially because he rejects "concept pragmatism," according to which the content of a concept is provided by its inferential role (ch. 7). She suggests that this problem threatens the coherence of his view:

The third problem concerns whether referentialism is even compatible with LOT to begin with, for Frege cases suggest that LOT's neo-Russellian-inspired generalizations . . . face counterexamples and are thus not viable. If Frege Cases cannot be solved, something is deeply wrong with LOT's current thinking about mental states. (p. 17)

But the Frege cases do not invite a worry about whether CTM and Fodor's semantic atomism are in "conflict" or "even compatible." The CTM is a theory that claims that mental processes are computations over representations; atomism, that the content of the primitive representations in the system is determined by a specific kind of co-variation relation between those representations and phenomena in the world. This is a perfectly coherent view, even if it fails for certain Frege cases: inadequacy, after all, is not internal contradiction. Nor does it exclude concepts from psychology, as Schneider appears at one point (p. 159) to suggest. What atomism rejects is a psychological account of concepts. This doesn't for a moment imply a rejection of a conceptual account of psychology. Fodor would be the first to agree that "thought is woven from concepts" (p. 159) -- he just doesn't think concepts are woven from thought!

Formal Syntax

Problem (2), about how to define an LOT symbol, is an interesting one, which Schneider correctly notes has not been seriously addressed by any of the LOTH's proponents. But although the problem does need to be addressed someday, this is unlikely to be any day soon. The present disregard of it surely has to do with the still very abstract level on which the LOT has been proposed. The main arguments for it are that it's needed to account for, e.g., the productivity, systematicity, casual efficacy, (ir)rationality, and hyper-intension­ality of thought (see Rey 1997:pp. 228-32, 253-5 for summary discussion). But this is an existential quantification, not a specification, which at this point would be wildly premature. No one yet has anything like an adequate idea of what all the expressive and processing demands on an LOT might be: What does it need toexplicitly represent, and what is represented only "implicitly"? How does an LOT represent, e.g., plurals, causation, properties, counterfactuals, propositional attitudes? Are the representations all digital, or are some analog? What about "images" and "non-conceptual" perceptual representations? And how, in any case, is any sort of "information" actually encoded in a computationally accessible way in -- neurons? mitochondria? networks? glial cells? Trying to sort out the identity of an LOT symbol at this point would seem like trying to decide on ink and font before a book is barely conceived -- and before we know even which inks and fonts are available.

In any event, the issue of how to classify symbols for an LOT is an instance of how to do it for formal languages generally -- what makes the Fregean, Polish, and various Peano notations mere notational variants of first-order logic? -- and it is by no means obvious how to do this, an issue that Schneider unfortunately does not discussOne of the main claims of her book is that, on pain of "missing psychological generalizations," symbols need to be individuated by "total computational role" (pp. 113, 128, 147). But surely the individuation of logical operators, such as negation or quantification, won't be in terms of their total computational role, say, in some (maybe inconsistent?!) theory in which one deploys them. If this were so, how could we do any meta-logic, or any general psychology of reasoning, noting and correcting common valid and fallacious inferences, as in, e.g., the work of Kahneman and Tversky? At least for the operators, some very small subset of roles are what's wanted -- plausibly the introduction and elimination rules -- just as specifying what it is to be, say, a bishop or knight in chess is in fact in terms of very specific legal moves, not in terms of the totality of (il-?)legal moves a player might make (cf. p. 114). Those alone should suffice to capture the relevant generalizations.

Referential Proposals

Tempting cases for individuation of symbols in terms of total roles might be the referential expres­sions in a language, specifically, its predicates and names (cf. p. 68). But here a natural suggestion is, instead, a largely referential one: e.g., a set of expressions is specified that will play the role of primitive predicates generally, and the most one might say across systems is that each might have a predicate with the same reference, say, the property bald or the bald things (Fodor 1998:p. 37, 2008:p. 88). Schneider does consider referential individuation, but rejects it, "because a referential manner of typing LOT expressions would ruin the prospects for naturalism" (p. 99). In one of the more baffling passages of the book, she writes:

If the intentionality of thought is supposed to reduce to a physical and non-intentional relation between symbols and the world, symbols themselves cannot be typed semantically. If symbols have semantic natures, the intentionality of thought wouldn't be explained using resources that are all naturalistically kosher, for the supervenience base would include semantic facts. (p. 100)

But if intentionality were in fact successfully reduced to non-intentional physical terms, then the intentionality of thought would be explained by using naturalistically kosher resources: that's just what a successful reduction permits! Indeed, supposing the syntactic category of predicates were provided by their role, Fodor might well then use some version of a co-variation semantics to individuate between them by their causes, just as one might appeal to temperature and pressure to distinguish thermometers from barometers, or Rembrandt paintings by their origins. All of this seems to me to undermine Schneider's main claim that "symbols must be individu­ated by what they do . . . [i.e.,] by the total computational role of the symbol" (p. 163, emphasis mine).

Frege Cases

Schneider goes on to argue that referential typing would face the problem of co-referential Frege cases, and of explaining behavior that turned on them (p. 100; ch. 7). But the problems here don't vitiate a "broad," referential individuation of predicates and names. A broad account might serve well at one level of explanation, as Schneider herself seems to allow in the case of the moon illusion (pp. 144-5) and the tendency of people not to marry their mothers (pp. 184, 208ff). What Frege cases do invite are perhaps more "narrow" individuations for explanations at other levels. But here again Schneider seems to neglect Fodor's (1987a, 1990, 1991, 1994, 2008) discussions where he has pursued a variety of ingenious strategies for dealing with many of them: for example, an appeal to syntactic constructions (which he hopes can distinguish, e.g., syntactically simple "water" from complex"H2O"); an appeal to properties as the referents of predicates, at least many of which he claims can be distinguished by different patterns of counterfactual co-variation (distinguishing, e.g., "renate" from "cordate"); and an appeal to physical realizations for at least intrapersonal cases (which he hopes can distinguish Oedipus' "Jocasta" from his "mother" thoughts). Schneider doesn't discuss the first, dismisses the second in a perfunctory footnote (p. 3 fn. 2), and gives the third oddly short shrift (odd, given that she notes its consonance with her cause, p. 177). Perhaps none of those three strategies will work completely for all the cases of co-referential proper names that most concern her ("Cicero"/"Tully", "Superman"/"Clark Kent," pp. 176-9), but perhaps the remaining cases are not crucial to a scientific psychology.

Schneider does note that much of psychology doesn't care about such cases: much explanation (e.g., of memory) is structural-functional analysis that is symbol neutral (pp. 140-7); and, again, some explanations appear to be "broad." On behalf of advancing this latter suggestion, she actually adopts one of Fodor's strategies, one to which he resorted briefly in his (1994: pp. 43-8): "Frege cases . . . are a breakdown in the normal course of events . . . because agents tend to be aware that two expressions co-refer when it's important to the success of their behavior" (p. 207).

But such a claim needs a lot more argument than either Schneider or Fodor provide. On the face of it, one would have thought that the virtual infinitude of hard-won equations of science and mathematics -- or just the common surprises of balancing one's checkbook! -- would suggest the contrary. Moreover, even when identities are "linked in [a person's] data base" (p. 215), explanations of what people want, how they reason, what they can readily notice and remember, are patently sensitive to the form in which they represent information, not merely to the worldly information itself: noticing (being aware that?) equilateral triangles are equilateral is different from noticing that they're equiangular, even when one knows they are; Ann wanting her son to be happy does not entail her wanting the self same mass-murderer to be, even when she knows he's the one (so her desires are inconsistent; what else is new?). Sensitivities to subjects' "modes of presentations" (MOPs) would hardly seem violations of ceteris paribus clauses: they are important data that a psychological theory is supposed to explain! It is difficult to think of very many attitudes in an explanatory psychology where this is generally not so, and where a presumption of a ceteris paribus transparency could reliably be maintained.

It is, of course, precisely in cases where transparency does break down that Schneider hopes her "pragmatic atomism" will help out. MOPs will be distinguishable by their syntax, which will be individuated by computational role. Here she's actually partly following Fodor (1994:ch. 2), who, again, distinguishes MOPS by logico-syntactic structure. But what about "Jocasta"/"Mother"? Here one might hope to distinguish them by computational role, which, again, for Schneider is their total computational role. But, as Schneider, following Fodor, rightly notes, a problem with such holism is that it's unlikely that people will share MOPs, since it's unlikely the total roles of their symbols will ever coincide. Schneider thinks this will not be a problem, however, since individuating MOPs is in her view an issue confined "within a system . . . ; it does not require a match in MOPs across systems" (p. 209, cf. p. 146).

But there are two worries here. Firstly, even within a system, identifying MOPs will surely be required across various stretches of time, e.g., the duration of Oedipus' confusions about Jocasta, during which, what with new perceptions and reasonings, the total role of a symbol will inevitably change; yet Oedipus had better remember for the duration that it's Jocasta that's his wife! Here, though, Fodor's (2008: pp. 72-5) recourse to the physical realization of Oedipus' symbols might suffice and deserves further discussion. A more serious problem, however, is that many MOPs are arguably required across populations, in cases of pred­i­cates where neither mere reference nor symbols' physical realizations (which may vary interpersonally) will suffice. This is most evident in cases of predicates, such as, e.g.,"ghost," "soul," "triangle," that (arguably) pick out necessarily empty or causally impotent properties, as well as response-depen­dent predicates such as "funny" and "sad," all of which are likely to figure in interesting psychological generali­zations, but whose references, given irresolvable disagreements, are likely to differ, even under idealization (see Rey 2009).

Schneider tries to accommodate the interpersonal cases that she allows might still arise by appeal to believed identities (or "matches") being a part of the ceteris paribus clause (pp. 150-1) -- a move that, again, seems doubtfully adequate -- and to the pragmatics of how laws might be worded to "call attention to a salient phenomenon" (p. 150) or to select "a certain description that expresses the reason for the action" (p. 151). She acknowledges that her critic might find these pragmatic moves a bit ad hoc (p. 151), but replies that it's not ad hoc to make the "reason for action more obvious" (p. 152). But a problem with these latter maneuvers is that they tend to concern the pragmatics of how the theorist represents a person's mind and not the semantics of how the person himself represents things. It's presumably the fact that people, themselves, represent problems in a certain way that explains, for example, their systematic errors in reasoning, not merely the pragmatically optional ways that the theorist may choose to state the explanations. It is the truth of such psychological generaliza­tions, not their pragmatic appropriateness, that is threatened by Schneider's proposal to individuate symbols by their total conceptual role.

Part of the difficulty here may be that it's not clear when Schneider is concerned with the demands of a scientific psychology, and when with only with singular causal explanations that are largely (as they are in the usual philosophical examples) confined to folk ascriptions, with all their pragmatic variations that Schneider allows. For example, serious psycho­logical generalizations seem seldom concerned with de re thoughts about specific individuals such as Jocasta or Cicero.[1] Perhaps this is why Fodor (1994: pp. 51-3) seems uncon­cerned about them, and thinks, as I mentioned, that recourse merely to symbols' physical realizations in a particular person will suffice. In any case, a plausible semantics for psychology is more likely to involve not representations of individuals, but of properties, which -- sometimes being real even if un-instantiated -- allow more referential leeway, precisely as they do in Fodor's hands. But this is why the problem of empty and response-dependent predicates and the properties they represent deserves more discussion than Schneider -- or Fodor -- provide.

Two last comments regarding problem (1), or Fodor's scepticism about the CTM as a theory of central cognition. Although in her chapter 3 Schneider raises some cogent objections to some of the specific arguments Fodor (2000, 2008) makes, she seems to me to miss the scepticism's overall force. I think she's quite right to observe (pp. 34-41) that the phenomena of globality, isotropy, and relevance do not per se -- and pace some arguments of Fodor -- show a domain to be computationally intractable. What I think Fodor really has in mind is the specific form these phenomena seem to take with respect to the vast diversity of domains of full human thought; it's accounting for belief fixation in this general and unwieldy array of domains that reasonably daunts Fodor (as it did Descartes [1637/1970: p. 116] before him). Proposals about parallel and long-distancing processing are well and good, but it's hard to see how they begin to address the serious issues about theory confirmation that Fodor (2008: pp. 113ff) is raising. Whether a thousand modules shout their outputs in serial or parallel, from near or afar, will not determine which of those outputs are relevant to which hypothesis, or which is the simplest, most conservative modification of one's views overall. As many of us think Hempel (1945) and Goodman (1954/83) proved against Carnap, confirmatory relevance, unlike syntactic deduction, seems to be an issue essentially involving the meaning of hypotheses and data and their complex relations to the rest of theory, not merely architectural features of the system. Indeed, Schneider would have done well to include discussion of Fodor's deeper (1987b) paper, in which he assimilates some of the problems here to the problems Goodman raised regarding "grue" (and to which one might have added Hempel's problem of the ravens: why are/aren't a million pennies relevant to confirming all ravens are black?)

In any event, Schneider's anxiety here is misplaced. It's simply not true that Fodor's scepticism about the CTM would show that "thought simply isn't symbolic" (p. 20), or "spell the end of the LOT program" (p. 33). As Fodor makes clear in the opening paragraph of the (2000) book, "There is . . . every reason to suppose that the Computational Theory is part of the truth about cognition" (2000: p. 1). There is, after all, all that systematicity, productivity, etc., to account for. His point is simply that it's not the wholetruth.

In sum: Schneider is concerned to defend some reasonable and important hypotheses, e.g., the LOTH, the CTM, and a computational role of symbol individuation. But they need to be defended with a great deal more care and detail if they are to meet the challenges raised by Fodor and others.


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[1] Schneider does discuss generalizations about thoughts involving Superman (pp. 149-52), mothers (p. 184) and the moon illusion (pp. 144ff), but arguably these are, for psychology, secondary, not especially law-like, cases, in which populations, living in the same contexts, simply happen to have the same beliefs or perceptual experiences about the same real objects.