The Law and Ethics of Medicine: Essays on the Inviolability of Human Life

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John Keown, The Law and Ethics of Medicine: Essays on the Inviolability of Human Life, Oxford University Press, 2012, 352pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199589555.

Reviewed by Don Marquis, University of Kansas


This book is based on the thesis that the inviolability of human life (IOL) is a fundamental principle of common law and of ethics. IOL, according to Keown, means that human life itself is a basic, intrinsic good. Intentional killing is always wrong. Keown discusses IOL's implications for issues at the beginning of life, such as abortion, embryos in vitro, and morning-after pills. He also discusses its implications for issues at the end of life, such as euthanasia, physician-assisted suicide and permanent vegetative state.

On the one hand, Keown admits that he has left to others a defense of IOL in its guise as an important thesis in philosophical ethics. This will certainly lessen the interest of this book for secular bioethicists. After all, rejection of IOL is central to secular bioethical orthodoxy -- at least as far as issues at the beginning of life are concerned and, to a lesser extent, as far as issues at the end of life are also concerned. On the other hand, virtually all the book is taken up with Keown's vigorous defense of the view that IOL (or a first cousin) is a fundamental principle of the common law. I believe that Keown is right about this -- although perhaps one should take this appraisal by a non-lawyer with a grain of salt.

Keown believes that IOL should be understood as qualified by the Doctrine of Double Effect (DDE). Critics of DDE complain that DDE's crucial distinction between what is intended and what is foreseen, but not intended, is both vague and ambiguous. They also complain that the moral significance of the distinction needs compelling defense. Keown does little to deal with those complaints.

In addition, it is important to note that the doctrine of battery is also a fundamental doctrine of the common law. According to the common law of battery competent adults have the right to refuse any medical care that a physician may offer, indeed, any "unconsented voluntary touching" whether the touching is called 'medical care' or not. Therefore, fidelity to the common law will yield an IOL qualified by the common law of battery, not DDE. The significance of this difference arises in cases in which a patient refuses ordinary medical care, such as ordinary antibiotics, or food and water, whether artificially provided or not or insulin injections, if the patient is a diabetic (69). Battery law seems to entail that such refusals must be respected, whereas DDE does not have this implication. Accordingly, battery law will underwrite more extensive qualification of IOL than DDE. Keown does little to deal with this either. But he should. If one wants to ground one's views on what is found in the common law, then presumably one does not pick and choose.

The vast majority of this book appears to be minor revisions of articles that Keown has previously published. These articles consist of disputations with other authors.

Keown's views on early human life are what one would expect from someone who regards IOL as a fundamental principle of ethics. He argues for the wrongness of abortion at any time during pregnancy and for the personhood of the embryo in vitro. He also argues that use of the morning-after pill is incompatible with the common law view that human life from fertilization on is entitled to protection. Given the ethical principle that Keown takes for granted, his views on these matters seem unproblematic.

Keown's discussions of end of life cases are often more interesting and more problematic. Keown argues, as one would expect, against the legalization of active euthanasia and physician-assisted suicide. Keown buttresses this position by arguing that the medical profession's failure to provide adequate palliative care for some patients at the end of life (or before the end of life) is "inexcusable". He advocates legislation making it an offense for physicians not to provide adequate pain relief. Keown's views concerning palliative care seem both reasonable and important.

Keown's view concerning persistent vegetative state (PVS) (where the VS is known to be irreversible) is both interesting and surprising. Such cases seem awkward for IOL's defenders. IOL, as leavened by DDE, certainly seems to imply that physicians have a duty to prolong such lives, at least so long as only ordinary care is required. Some IOLer's will bite that bullet. Nevertheless, the prolongation of a life in which the patient lacks awareness and never will recover it certainly seems pointless. Those of us who reject IOL believe that IOL analysis of such cases provides a reason for rejecting IOL.

Keown, surprisingly, rejects what many believe to be the obvious implications of IOL. He says that since no medical treatment can "restore those in PVS to anything approaching a state of health and well-functioning, it is futile and need not be provided." (339) Keown's view is puzzling, for two reasons. In the first place, one wonders how an IOLer can regard a treatment as futile if it is sufficient (and necessary) to support the continuation of "the fundamental good of human life". In the second place, there are many patients who are not in PVS, but who are ill or disabled and for whom there are treatments that are efficacious, but will not restore them to "anything approaching a state of health and well-functioning". Plainly it often would be wrong to withhold such treatment from such patients. Keown's view on the ethics of treating PVS patients seems both (1) inconsistent with IOL, which he champions, and (2) supported by reasons that are patently unsound.

Keown's views concerning the treatment of patients who wish to commit suicide by refusing life-saving medical treatment are also puzzling. Such cases seem to be instances in which the implications of Keown's version of IOL (with DDE) and the implications of orthodox medical ethics oriented around the common law of battery diverge. Consider how DDE deals with removing or refusing extraordinary life preserving treatment. A treatment will be extraordinary on the condition that the burdens of the treatment outweigh the benefits of the treatment. DDE holds that it is not wrong for a physician to refrain from providing extraordinary treatment because her intention in so doing is to spare the patient the burdens of the treatment even if the death of the patient is a foreseen, but unintended, consequence. Since, presumably, the patient may refuse the treatment if the burdens of the treatment outweigh the benefits, analysis of extraordinary means based on the common law of battery will yield the same judgment. This DDE justification for non-treatment is not available in the case of ordinary treatment that, by definition, only involves minimal or no burdens to the patient, although, of course, the common law of battery can underwrite patient refusal of ordinary treatment. Therefore, the DDE justification for non-treatment is not available if a patient intends to end his life by refusing ordinary treatment.

This is a difficult issue for anyone who wishes to think hard about cases in which a patient wishes to end his life by refusing ordinary care. Keown discusses cases of patients who are competent, chronically dependent on medical treatment and who wish to refuse further treatment. (75) Of course, Keown regards physician-assisted suicide as morally wrong. Furthermore, Keown rejects "spurious distinctions between acts and omissions." (74,76) He talks freely of suicide by omission. (77) Nevertheless, Keown says that

it could be homicide for a doctor intentionally to shorten the patient's life by disconnection, even at the patient's request, but that it would not be homicide if the doctor's intention were solely to respect the patient's right to refuse treatment, even if the doctor foresaw that the patient would die as a consequence . . . even if the doctor believes, and believes rightly, that the patient's reasons for refusing treatment are misguided, even self-destructive. (75-76)

In his discussion of this case, Keown seems to have committed himself to the battery exception to IOL. I do not understand how he can square this view with his commitment to DDE. No one, of course, should suppose that these cases are easy.

There is another issue that induces a worry about Keown's views. He holds that

All human beings possess, in virtue of their common humanity, an inherent, inalienable, and ineliminable dignity. The dignity of human beings inheres because of the radical capacities, such as for understanding, rational choice, and free will, inherent in human nature. (5)

Keown also affirms that:

All human being possess the capacities inherent in their nature even though, because of infancy, disability, or senility, they may not yet, not now, or no longer have the ability to exercise them. (5)

It certainly seems that humans deep into senility, or with major mental retardation, or with PVS do not possess "the capacities . . . for understanding, rational choice and free will." Keown does not bother to explain how this is possible. Keown's rationale for IOL seems incompatible with how he wishes to apply IOL in such cases.