The Legacy of Kant in Sellars and Meillassoux: Analytic and Continental Kantianism

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Fabio Gironi (ed.), The Legacy of Kant in Sellars and Meillassoux: Analytic and Continental Kantianism, Routledge, 2017, 248pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138703674.

Reviewed by Steven Levine, University of Massachusetts, Boston


A volume of essays comparing the thought of two philosophers is always worrying. Often the comparison is forced and more a product of the need to find fresh topics to publish on than of advancing genuine philosophical insight. This worry is especially acute when the two philosophers compared are as disparate and difficult as Sellars and Meillassoux. From an external point of view it is clear why they have been brought together: Ray Brassier wrote about Sellars in his book Nihil Unbound and in the process got many students in contemporary continental philosophy interested in this somewhat idiosyncratic analytic philosopher. Insofar as reading Sellars gives one a point of entry into a vein of analytic philosophy (the so-called Pittsburgh School) that is able to speak to the concerns of philosophical traditions that take seriously the legacy of German Idealism, it makes sense that Sellars would be a privileged interlocutor for those who stand in these traditions. But is there a more intimate connection between these two thinkers, an internal point of purchase that allows for reciprocal evaluation and critique? The gamble of this volume is that there is. Does the gamble pay off? Like most collections, the volume is uneven. Several essays in it are well written, thought provoking, and philosophically illuminating, while a few are less so. But overall, the volume does achieve something important: it demonstrates that Meillassoux's speculative materialism is not an eccentric position to be found in some far-off corner of continental philosophy, but a serious and interesting position that should be engaged by those who stand in other traditions of contemporary philosophy.

The volume contains an introduction  and ten essays. The introduction by Gironi and the essays by Aude Bandini and Anna Longo are concerned with providing some historical context for, as Bandini put it, this "Most Unlikely Encounter." Bandini insightfully explains why Sellars has not been received in France, while Longo situates both Sellars and Meillassoux in the context of the post-Kantian debates between Schulze, Maïmon, and Fichte about how to inherit Kantian philosophy. She shows how both Sellars and Meillassoux are responding to meta-critical questions about reason that were first raised in those debates, which pushes them beyond finitude. The essays by Gabriel Catren and Joseph Cohen, focus only on Meillassoux. The others (by James R. O'Shea, Ray Brassier, Carl B. Sachs, Dionysis Christias, Muhannad Hariri, and Daniel Sacilotto) stage a confrontation between Sellars and Meillassoux. I shall focus on the latter.

The internal point of purchase for comparing Sellars and Meillassoux is, of course, Kant and the legacy of transcendental philosophy generally. Both Sellars and Meillassoux think 'through Kant', though Sellars rehabilitates major elements of the Kantian picture while Meillassoux aims to reject, in toto, what he calls the "Kantian catastrophe." In this respect the volume's major question is: can Sellars' modified Kantianism, which includes within it a scientific realism, avoid the major deficiency that Meillassoux finds in Kant's theoretical philosophy, namely, that it is correlationism that can't do justice to the fact that thought can be in touch with things as they are in-themselves? Most of the essays that directly take up the comparison between Sellars and Meillassoux answer this question in the affirmative. Though there is somewhat more discussion of Meillassoux's position than Sellars', in this respect the collection is weighted toward Sellars.

The volume begins with O'Shea's essay, which interrogates Meillassoux's reading of Kant. As Brassier points out, Meillassoux's aim, in After Finitude and other writings, is not to give a scholarly account of Kant. Rather, his goal is to identify within Kant the 'picture that holds us captive', i.e., the deep philosophical grammar that determines to a large extent the thought moves of post-Kantian positions that on the surface are opposed to one another, i.e., phenomenology and the various kinds of post-modern thought. This grammar is correlationist. By this, Meillassoux means "the idea according to which we only ever have access to the correlation between thinking and being, and never to either term considered apart from the other" (Meillassoux 2008: 5). O'Shea does not reject the idea that Kant is a correlationist. But he claims that Kant is an 'objective' and 'formal' correlationist, rather than a subjective one, as Meillassoux posits. In essence, O'Shea charges, Meillassoux reads Kant through Berkeley, with predictable results. O'Shea also lays out the basics of his influential reading of Sellars and tries to detail the modifications in Sellars' view that are necessary for him to articulate a consistent and plausible Kantian naturalist empirical realism.

A central topic of the other essays that compare the two authors is Meillassoux's account of the correlationist dilemma and his escape from it. The dilemma says that because it is impossible to think of any object without that object being given, that anything that is purportedly in-itself is in fact always for-us, and so never absolute -- not a term of a correlation between thinking and being. Meillassoux's realist exit from this reasoning follows dialectically from the internal deficiencies that he identifies in three positions: weak correlationism (Kant), speculative idealism (Hegel), and strong correlationism (Heidegger and other post-metaphysical positions). Weak correlationism says that we can only know the for-us, but we can think, without inconsistency, the in-itself. The speculative idealist denies the in-itself. But rather than saying that we can only know the for-us, they 'absolutize the correlation' and conclude, as Brassier puts it, "that what is for-us is also in-itself" (68). Strong correlationism makes two moves. First, it accepts the critical idea that all absolutes are relative to the correlation, but then, in a second move, it blocks the absolutization of the correlation by claiming that the correlation is itself contingent. The correlation is factical; it is a fact that could have been otherwise or not have been. While in strong correlationism there is an identification of the in-itself and for-us insofar as what appears or is manifest is relative to a conceptual scheme or horizon of intelligibility, it also posits that that scheme or horizon could have been otherwise. As such, we have a meta-understanding that this identification is only for-us.

It is here that Meillassoux makes his most important move. With the admission that the correlation is contingent, the strong correlationist must admit that we "can positively think of a possibility independent of the correlation, since this is precisely the possibility of the non-being of the correlation" (Meillassoux 2014: 12). To escape absolute idealism, the strong correlationist is compelled to think something absolute beyond the correlation, but now, as Brassier points out, the absolute is "not a thing that is but the 'may-be' of every thing" (70). Meillassoux rejects the principle of sufficient reason and accepts the 'principle of unreason': there is no reason for any fact, including the correlation itself. In embracing the principle of unreason we intellectually intuit that the only thing that is necessary and absolute is contingency itself.

Brassier aims to provide an alternative path out of the correlationist dilemma based upon Sellars' theory of modality. Sellars rejects modal realism. He instead holds that modal claims are, in Brandom's terms, expressive: they make explicit certain features of ordinary descriptive discourse, namely, the inference tickets that pertain between empirical claims. Modal vocabulary is a pragmatic meta-vocabulary that allows us to say what we are doing when we put forward empirical descriptions. In utilizing this meta-vocabulary, we can distinguish between what is done in saying something (the pragmatic inferences made) and what is said in saying it (the semantic inferences). Identifying these two levels, Brassier argues, "provides a leverage point allowing us to prise apart correlating and correlated, thinking and thought" (79). The basic idea is that what is contingent and necessary at the level of what is being done in making claims is distinct from what is contingent and necessary at the level of what is said in these claims. Correlationism confuses the necessity that pertains to the relations between the contents of sayings with the necessity of the connection between such contents and the act in which we do something in so saying. In undoing this confusion, we can escape correlationism without, as Meillassoux does, reifying modality by treating it in the material mode.

Sachs argues that Sellars' concept of picturing gives us a different way of avoiding correlationism and the correlationist dilemma. Sellars, on Sachs' reading, is a pragmatic naturalist who accepts Peirce's idea that truth and reality are equivalent with what a community of inquirers will discover in the long run. But Sellars' version of this idea is not correlationist because he evaluates our evolving conceptual schemes from two points of view: from the semantic point of view within a given conceptual scheme (and so within the 'manifest image'), and from the point of view of picturing, i.e., from the point of view of the real relations that that scheme (now understood as an 'animal representational system') has with reality. If we reject the Myth of the Given and see that the point of view of the manifest image can be surpassed, the community of inquirers is compelled to move from the first point of view to the second insofar as the second explains the conditions of possibility for the first. But this means, as Sachs puts it, that if "strong correlationism is the Myth of the Given about the manifest image, then strong correlationism is overcome from within because the correlation cannot explain itself" (97). Sachs then goes on the evaluate Meillassoux's naturalism and finds it wanting. In so doing, he proposes a pragmatic position that escapes the disjunction set up between the principle of sufficient reason and Meillassoux's principle of unreason. I find this a promising avenue for future research.

Christias argues that Sellars and Meillassoux converge on a certain essential insight. They both aim to "disentangle the sound insights of Kantian transcendentalism from what they both take to be its fundamental error, namely the thesis of the in principle inaccessibility of the 'in-itself'" (128). But the two authors disagree about the status of the transcendental. On Christias' reading of Sellars -- a reading that converges with O'Shea's, Brassier's, and Hariri's -- the transcendental for Sellars cannot be captured in descriptive and explanatory terms, but only in practical and normative terms. What this means is that the transcendental level is expressive, not descriptive: it makes explicit the rules that are implicit in the use of first order descriptive concepts. While the level of the transcendental is, for Sellars, indispensable and not reducible to the level of description, we should not think of it as a "non-empirical level of being" (134). In other words, we should not 'ontologize' the transcendental, but maintain its formal character. Christias' main criticism of Meillassoux is that he does not adhere to this injunction. Meillassoux instead argues that there is a sui generis categorical structure for every possible world (the modal structure of necessity and contingency) that we can intuit intellectually. In so doing, Christias claims, Meillassoux falls prey to what Sellars calls the Myth of the Categorical Given.

I have only touched the surface of the themes taken up in this volume. Hariri's essay interestingly brings together Meillassoux's speculations about extro-science worlds with Sellars' projective metaphysics, while Sacilotto's clear and cogent essay shows how the sense-reference distinction can work to overcome the correlationist dilemma. Similarly, I have not discussed in any detail the authors' various readings of the Sellarsian project. But I hope my brevity on these issues will tempt the reader to pick up this provocative book.


Meillassoux, Quentin, 2008. After Finitude: An Essays on the Necessity of Contingency, Ray Brassier (tr.). Continuum.

Meillassoux, Quentin, 2014. Time Without Becoming, Anna Longo (ed.). Mimesis International.