The Leibniz-Stahl Controversy

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G.W. Leibniz, The Leibniz-Stahl Controversy, François Duchesneau and Justin E. H. Smith (eds., trs.), Yale University Press, 2016, lxx + 443pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300161144.

Reviewed by Anne-Lise Rey, Université Paris Nanterre


This new volume of the Yale Leibniz presents for the first time a full English translation, together with an edition of the Latin text, of the controversy between Leibniz and the physician Georg Ernst Stahl. The volume meets the highest standards of scholarly publishing.

Leaving aside the fairly free French nineteenth-century translation by Blondin [Baillière, 1860], long the only guide to Stahl's complicated writing, the exchanges between Leibniz and Stahl have been published in two forms in recent years. The first is the Stahl-Leibniz. Controverse sur la vie, l'organisme et le mixte (Paris: Vrin, 2004), a translation of Leibniz's texts (Animadversiones in G.E. Stahlii Theoriam medicam and Replicatio ad Stahlianas Observationes) by Sarah Carvallo. This translation is preceded by an introduction that places Leibniz's theses on life, the organism and the monad in the intellectual context of his time. Even so, the choice of publishing Leibniz's texts without Stahl's contributions sometimes makes it difficult to understand what is at stake in the texts. The second recent edition is that of Antonio Nunziante, Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Obiezioni contro te teoria medica di Georg Ernst Stahl. Sui concetti di anima, vita, organismo (Macerata: Quodlibet, 2011). This is an Italian translation of Animadversiones in G.E. Stahlii Theoriam medicam, followed by a nice essay "Vita e organismo tra filosofia e medicina: le ragioni di una polemica," which gives a rigorous account of the exchanges between Leibniz and Stahl. Though both texts present the Latin text together with a translation, both limit the text to Leibniz's contribution and omit Stahl's half of the exchange.

The new Yale volume differs radically from those previous volumes since it presents, for the first time, a full translation of all of Leibniz's texts together with all the texts Stahl wrote in connection with their exchange. It gives us the means to consider Stahl as a real scientist with consistent philosophical theses, not just as a foil for Leibniz's "genius".

The editors, François Duchesneau and Justin E. H. Smith, are among the most important specialists on Leibniz's theories of life. Duchesneau, the author of Leibniz, le vivant et l'organisme,[1] was one of the first to call attention to Leibniz's views on the life sciences. The methodological concerns, present in his earliest work, La Physiologie des Lumières, have led him to highlight the close and complex links between life sciences and natural philosophy in the Leibnizian corpus. In his Les modèles du vivant de Descartes à Leibniz [Vrin, 1998] and his recent Organisme et corps organique de Leibniz à Kant[2], Duchesneau highlighted the contexts in which methodological principles and instrumental practices are used. In his major work, Divine Machines,[3] Smith re-evaluated the philosophical stakes of empirical life sciences in Leibniz's thought, forcing us to re-evaluate Leibniz's position on a number of important philosophical questions.

The long introduction by the editors helps us to understand the major issues of the controversy. From an internal point of view, the tight account of the arguments is a key contribution. The introduction shows the internal coherence of the argumentation, allowing us to evaluate the theses argued in the texts. Duchesneau  and Smith go a long way toward making the presuppositions of Leibniz's and Stahl's natural philosophy comprehensible. The introduction is not a mere summary of these works, but an analysis and a very sophisticated reflection on some major themes raised by the exchange. First of all, there is the reflection on the very notion of organism. In this respect, I believe that the analyses of the difficult notions of organism and mechanism have never been discussed as clearly as they are here. But it is also notable that the editors take Stahl's philosophical position very seriously in its own right, in contrast to most previous readings, which treat Stahl in this context only as a pretext for reading Leibniz's texts. Duchesneau  and Smith appreciate the importance of Stahl's writings on chemistry and medicine for understanding the natural philosophy of their time.

It is not possible to discuss in full detail the richness of this volume, but I would like to highlight the main contributions this edition makes to the understanding not only of Leibniz's thought, but of both Leibniz's and Stahl's philosophies. In addition, I would like to note the way in which this edition allows us to understand how the chemical and medical writings at issue fit into the corpus of early modern philosophy.

The first issue is physiological: alongside a search for the well-being of the body, many physicians engaged in a search for the way in which the body is organized. It led them to carry out systematic studies of anatomy and physiology. This is the case in Descartes and Locke, who share the same model of intelligibility, despite the fact that they don't have the same approach. This difference doesn't affect issues in physiology. This is the case more generally for physicians and philosophers of this time who do not exemplify the two approaches. But this is one of the strong differences between Leibniz and Stahl.

The relevant distinction is rather between tradition and innovation. The innovation in question is the new philosophy that identifies the body as a machine. Although Duchesneau  and Smith's introduction is quite right to emphasize the complexity of this identification and the need to appreciate its centrality, for Descartes the explanation of living bodies is important, so we must take account of the continuity of the legacies of Aristotle and Galen more than their discontinuities. It is also important to emphasize the iatrochemistry of this era, despite the multiple and diverse uses made of it.

This close relationship with tradition is, naturally, accompanied with ontological and epistemological discontinuities. This is precisely what underlies and structures the opposition between Leibniz's rational medicine and Stahl's vital medicine. Leibniz's rational medicine provides intelligible causes, when possible, and useful consequences from the effects. On the other hand, Stahl's vital medicine rejects the microstructural approach to medicine and considers that it is the soul that is directly responsible for bodily structures.

The second issue focuses on the distinction made by Stahl between organism and mechanism and its consequences for thinking about the powers of the soul. In his "Disquisitio de mechanism et organismi diversitate", one of the introductory essays of the Theoria medica vera, the distinction between organism and mechanism intervenes to justify the irreducibility of mechanical aggregates to purely mechanical combinations (as micro-mechanistic as they are!). In a way, the concept of organism is used by Stahl to show the limits of a mechanical model of explanation. This irreducibility naturally leads to the introduction of finalism.

By "mechanism", Stahl means a type of physical entity that can be fully analyzed using geometric-mechanical properties. Mechanism can also be explained by the operations of a motive faculty that lacks an end, a purpose, an intention. On the contrary, he identifies the organism as the main feature of natural entities in which an autonomous instrumental relation is exercised. From this point of view, the organism cannot be reduced to a mechanism animated by an external end. And it cannot be conceived along the lines of a self-contained animated anatomy. The soul must induce the body to generate its own organization through subtle and complex movements. In this context, Stahl evokes the specific powers of the soul and offers a holistic conception of the body.

Having the means to compare precisely this view with the Leibnizian conception of organism allows us to understand organism first as organization. The organic body is for Leibniz an infinite collection of microscopic bodies. This makes it possible to characterize it as an infinite machine of nature, an animal composed of an infinite set of substantial units. And to complete the picture, we must mention the importance of the conceptuality of dynamics (the concepts of force and action) to understand this conception of the machine of nature.

Finally, let us add that Leibniz and Stahl also differ on the potentialities of chemical analysis. While Leibniz affirms the importance of chemistry for rational medicine, Stahl rejects chemistry as a source of explanation for pathological and physiological functions.

With the help of this new edition, we are led to understand very clearly that there certainly is a distinction between Leibniz and Stahl, but a distinction between two consistent positions. We can now understand how, each in his own unique way, strives to combine mechanism and teleology.

The last issue concerns ethics. Although Leibniz's and Stahl's philosophies differ, as do their medical philosophies, both still believe in the profound connection between the advancement of medicine and the progress of morality, advancements that for both belong to the field of philosophy.

In short, what is unique about the introduction to this critical edition is how it brings together and enables reflection upon: 1) the relationship between philosophical positions and epistemological choices (especially through its explanation of the difference between Leibniz's rational medicine and the vital medicine of Stahl); 2) placing this relationship in the context of its relation to moral reflection (different interpretations of vivisection, reflection upon progressing morality); and 3) showing the complexity of the epistemological choices made by Leibniz and Stahl (for example, in demonstrating the role of iatrochemistry).

[1] F. Duchesneau, Leibniz, le vivant et l'organisme, Paris, Vrin, 2010, F. Duchesneau, La Physiologie des Lumières. Empirisme, modèles et théories, La Haye, Boston & Londres, M. Nijhoff, 1982 ; F. Duchesneau, Les modèles du vivant de Descartes à Leibniz, Paris, Vrin, 1998.

[2] F. Duchesneau, Organisme et corps organique de Leibniz à Kant, Paris, Vrin, Mathesis, 2018.

[3] J. Smith, Divine Machines. Leibniz and the Sciences of Life, Princeton, Princeton University Press, 2011. This one has to be completed with two others edited with O. Nachtomy: Machines of Nature and Corporeal Substances in Leibniz, The New Synthese Historical Library, Springer, vol. 67, 2011, and The Life Sciences in Early Modern Philosophy, Oxford, Oxford University Press, 2014.