The Letters of George Santayana Book One, [1868]-1909 and Vol. V of The Works of George Santayana

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Holzberger, William G. ed., The Letters of George Santayana Book One, [1868]-1909, Vol. V of The Works of George Santayana, eds. Holzberger, William G. and Herman J. Saatkamp Jr., MIT Press, 2001, 582pp, $58.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-262-19457-0

Reviewed by Michael Hodges, Vanderbilt University


This work is the first of a projected eight volumes devoted to the letters of George Santayana. At the same time, those eight books constitute Volume 5 of The Works of George Santayana. If this first book is anything to go by, we can expect to be informed and entertained by all of them. Apparently there are about 3000 letters by Santayana and they range from family letters to business correspondence with his publisher, Charles Scribner’s Sons. There are letters to various friends and a variety of philosophers such as Russell, Royce and James. The first book contains letters from 1868 when Santayana was only five, to 1909 by which time he had already published The Life of Reason and achieved a certain fame. The overall plan is to present the letters in chronological order with the final letter being to Daniel Cory in August of 1952 shortly before his death. This review will focus only on the first book.

Simply to get the matter out of the way, there is one glaring error in the proposed chronology. There is a letter that is dated before 1889? where the question mark indicates doubt. Such doubt is surely correct for the letter to C.A. Strong, a philosopher and friend of Santayana, mentions Einstein and his theory of relativity but Einstein was only ten years old in 1889 and, as is well known, did not publish on the theory until 1905. The date is especially unforgivable since the citation includes a footnote giving Einstein’s dates (1879-1955). We can surely assume that the date of the letter is later than 1905. Beyond this case, however, there seems to be no reason to distrust the dating of the letters in this first book. Each letter is dated, its recipient identified as well as its place of origin and the location of the original. Useful contextual information in given in the footnotes. Persons mentioned in the letters are identified along with books or other materials. In some cases historical material is included which helps to place the letters in their contexts. Along with the letters, the editors have included comprehensive textural notes, a helpful chronology of Santayana’s life, a listing of Santayana’s addresses, locations of the various manuscripts and a list of all the recipients, as well as a list of letters known to exist but which have not been found. The introduction, which ranges over all the correspondence and not just this volume, is useful both for those interested in Santayana’s life and for those interested in his thought. Holzberger surveys many themes in Santayana’s philosophy and pinpoints key letters that shed light on them (for examples see below). He also takes up a number of controversies and issues about Santayana’s life and points the reader in the direction of letters that illuminate them. Among others he discusses are Santayana’s attitudes toward women and Jews. At all these technical levels the book is very well done but of course the most interesting and exciting aspect is the letters themselves.

In these letters, we come close to the person George Santayana, at least in his younger days. He is a man with an interest in football (Letter to Forbes, November 1 1896) and, perhaps not surprisingly, in bull fighting. He writes to his sister in Avilla, “It looks as if nothing would interrupt my journey and arrival on the 2nd unless I should find an irresistible bull-fight going on in Burgos or Valladolid.” (Sept 26, 1905) He is a man who has a ribald sense of humor. In one letter to William Fullerton (Dec. 28, 1887) he offers a lively discussion of the alternatives that present themselves to a boy after he “gets his first experience in the art of love” (p. 92). He is totally at home with language and seems to write poetry as easily as prose. He can put himself in various other styles. For example, he writes letters in the style of the Arabian Nights that are very entertaining. (Letter to Mary Berenson, Nov. 25, 1904). Of course, there are mundane letters as well, to his publisher for example, that deal with the details of the publication of his works.

Another interesting aspect of the letters is what they reveal about the intersection of Santayana’s life with many noteworthy individuals of the time. A few examples include the following: his friend C. A. Strong married J.D. Rockefeller’s daughter; he is a friend of Isabella Stewart Gardner whose home is now an important museum in Boston; William Randolph Hearst was in his class at Harvard. His life intersected with the Russell family in England. Of course there are letters to or references concerning most of the important philosophers of the tradition and the day including Bergson, Heidegger, James, Dewey, Russell, and Moore. It is always insightful to come to know Santayana’s opinions and often entertaining. For example, he sums up his opinion of Principia Ethica by saying, “The book seems to contain a grain of accuracy in a bushel of inexperience,” referring to what is obvious for Santayana, the irreducibility of the good but confusing that with it unconditionality.

However, what is most interesting and revealing in these letters is the extent to which the main ideas of his mature philosophy are in place very early on. Santayana’s distinctive relativism is already in place as indicated in a number of letters particularly to Ward Abbot in 1887. The symbolic character of knowledge which is a central feature of his mature views is foreshadowed in the letter to Abbot (May 29, 1887) and also to William James in December of that year. His epiphenomenalism is expressed in a letter to C.A. Strong in 1890. “If you mean only that no energy is spent on thought, and that mind wherever it may appear, is an epiphenomenon, I sympathize with you.” Further on he says, ‘The mind would have to be treated as a parasite, if that can be called a parasite which comsumes (sic) nothing of the substance on which it lives.” (p. 115)

Certainly, there is much that is revealing about his views on religion. In a letter to James in December of 1905 he says, “Religion in particular was found out more than too (sic) hundred years ago, and it seems to me intolerable that we should still be condemned to ignore the fact and to give the parsons and the ‘idealists’ a monopoly on indignation and of contemptuous dogmatism.” Here Santayana rejects religion as an alternative to physics and as a source or ground of values. Much earlier in a letter to Strong (Jan 29, 1889) we find a subtle argument to show God’s judgments could provide no basis for any value unless they are accompanied by a physical sanction or are already in agreement with our own judgments. The heart and soul of Interpretations of Poetry and Religion is summarized in a letter to William Thayer on May 29 1900. “I want my metaphysics and religion to be good poetry…. I am glad to have it has full and interesting as possible, a real counterpart and idealization of life. Therefore I prefer Catholic ideas to Protestant, and Pagan ideas to Catholic: or if you like, I would only accept Christianity as a form of Paganism. For in Paganism I see the only religion that tries to do justice to all life, and at the same time retain the consciousness that it is a kind of poetry.”

Santayana’s distinctive materialism is also to be found throughout. There is an especially revealing letter in which he consoles a friend on the death of his father (To Lawrence Butler Dec. 21, 1901). He says, “This world is so ordered that we must, in a material sense, lose everything we have and love, one thing after another, until we ourselves close our eyes upon the whole.” Santayana’s materialism is no mere philosophy. It informs his life and he does not shy away from its consequence even in difficult moments.

One final example may suffice to show the extent to which even as a very young man Santayana is already in possession of a subtle and comprehensive view which is consistently articulated throughout his life. In one of the 1887 letters to Abbot we find Santayana writing, “There are certain convictions which cannot be exiled from the mind, convictions about everyday practical matters, about history, and about the ordinary passions of men. A system starting from these universal convictions has a foothold in every mind, and can coerce that mind to accept at least some of its content.” (p. 64). To anyone who has read Skepticism and Animal Faith, this will seem to be torn from the introduction but Skepticism was not published until 1923, 36 years later.

The person revealed in these letters is a philosopher in the deepest sense of that term. He is a person for whom thought’s task is to inform living. His philosophy is, at every turn, revealed as of a piece with his life. This is as rare in the academic world as is the breath of vision that is Santayana’s.