The Lewd, the Rude and the Nasty

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Pekka Väyrynen, The Lewd, the Rude and the Nasty, Oxford University Press, 2013, 271pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199314751.

Reviewed by Matthew S. Bedke, University of British Columbia


Suppose I begin like this: Pekka Väyrynen has written a rich, insightful book. He deftly plumbs the evidence on just how thick terms communicate evaluative content, and he fairly, judiciously comes down in favor of a pragmatic theory.

I have just tried to employ some thick terms -- as the tradition would have it, terms that build into their meanings both description and evaluation. 'Deftly', for example, would be an inaccurate description of a clumsy, inept analysis. And in saying it was deft I am not remaining neutral on the quality I'm describing. I am also indicating its positive value.

According to Väyrynen's main thesis, however, with those opening expressions I have not yet said the book is any good. As he might put it, no global, overall positive evaluation is inherent in the meaning of my thick terms. That is, no such evaluation is part of the conventional, encoded semantic content of what I said, nor is it semantically presupposed or conventionally implicated by what I said. So I could with complete semantic propriety follow up with, "Yet I have nothing good to say about this book".

Of course, I do have good things to say about the book. And Väyrynen helps me out by maintaining that global positive evaluation gets communicated by those opening expressions. Only for him the action is within the domain of pragmatics. For he defends the Pragmatic View

Global T-evaluations [thick-evaluations] are implications of T-utterances which are normally "not at issue" in their literal uses in normal contexts, and which arise conversationally (127).

As Väyrynen sketches the view, a thick term like 'lewd' can come to be used only by people who have the relevant evaluations -- here, negative evaluations of the sexually explicit -- presumably as a kind of statistical regularity. If this pattern of usage becomes common knowledge, the evaluation can become a generalized pragmatic implication whenever someone uses 'lewd'. For why would you use 'lewd' if you don't accept the relevant negative evaluation, knowing that only people with such an evaluation use that term? That way lies the potential to mislead and violate conversational norms.

If this is on the right track, some negative global evaluation would be intimately connected with the thick term 'lewd', but the connection would fall short of being an inherent part of the meaning of the thick term.

A good chunk of the book (chs. 3 and 4) argues directly against an attractive alternative: the Semantic View, or the view that global evaluations are part of the semantic content of predications using thick terms (59). (Väyrynen carefully considers other views as well, such as presupposition views, various implicature views, etc. (see chapter 5), but let me set those to one side). Väyrynen discusses a slew of evidence bearing on the issue, but two pieces strike me as key: 1) the evaluations communicated by thick terms project outside of certain embedded contexts (projection), and 2) there are contexts where one can use a thick term and go on to cancel any associated global evaluation without any sense of linguistic impropriety (defeasibility).

To see how projection works, consider 1and certain ways of embedding its content (62-64).

1. Madonna's show is lewd.

1a. Nah, Madonna's show is not lewd.

1b. Is Madonna's show lewd?

1c. Madonna's show might be lewd.

1d. If Madonna's show is lewd, the tabloid press will go nuts.

On the Semantic View, part of 1's truth-conditional content is something like this:

2. Overt displays of sexuality that transgress conventional boundaries are bad in a certain way (62).

If so, then by embedding 'lewd' as in 1a-1d, one should thereby avoid asserting this negative content, just as one avoids saying that the show is expensive by asserting 'Madonna's show is not expensive'. If so, lewd objectors -- those who do not think that overt displays of sexuality that transgress conventional boundaries are bad in a certain way -- should have no qualms using 1a-1d. Yet they do. If you don't think overt sexual displays are thereby bad, you would not use 1a-1d, at least not literally. So it would seem that the negative global evaluations associated with 'lewd' project outside of certain embeddings. This is contrary to the prediction of the Semantic View.

To see how defeasibility works, consider this sentence:

3. Whether or not Madonna's show is lewd, it's not bad in any way distinctive of explicit sexual display (70).

Now, if the global negative evaluation of 2is not part of the semantic content of 'lewd', it should be possible to use 'lewd' as in 3without any semantic impropriety. On the other hand, if the negative evaluation is part of the semantic content, 3 should strike us an improper. According to Väyrynen, 3is acceptable, and so this weighs against the Semantic View.

To the extent they generalize to other thick terms (see 149), these considerations weigh against the Semantic View and in favor of Väyrynen's Pragmatic View. For the Pragmatic View can explain projection -- negative evaluations project outside of embeddings because people don't use those terms, embedded or not, in line with conversational norms unless they have the evaluative attitude -- and defeasibility -- because the evaluation is a generalized conversational implicature, the right pragmatic context can allow one to cancel any normal suggestion that one has the evaluative attitude.

Väyrynen adds that the Pragmatic View is a simpler explanation. Better to explain the phenomena with general mechanisms from pragmatics than to posit semantic properties for thick terms (55, 116, 123).

This barely scratches the surface when it comes to Väyrynen's acumen with matters linguistic. But let me pause here to register a reservation. While I grant Väyrynen the projection data -- at least for certain contexts (belief attributions involving thick terms do not seem to feature projection) -- I am less certain about the defeasibility data. 3 strikes me as semantically improper. I suspect that I am not alone in having a strong sense that one cannot appropriately use the term 'lewd' in literal contexts without having certain negative evaluations of sexual displays (cf. 70, nt. 43).

Väyrynen uses other examples of felicitous use to pressure the Semantic View, but I find some of them similarly tricky. Consider these sentences.

4. Whether or not this is a good thing, John can be truthfully and neutrally described as being considerate (84, 105).

5. The carnival was a lot of fun. But something was missing. It just wasn't lewd. I hope it'll be lewd next year (85).

Väyrynen takes the propriety of 4among considerate agnostics (people who find nothing globally good or bad about being considerate) to indicate that these evaluations are not semantically encoded. And he takes the propriety of 5as either evidence against the Semantic View, or at best explained away by the Semantic View as an inverted commas use.

To the extent these sentences have felicitous uses it is not clear to me that our intuitions are narrowly tapping into the semantic propriety of the sentence, or broadly tapping into the overall communicative propriety of the sentence, perhaps at the expense of semantic propriety. This second phenomenon does happen. Consider a tolerant person, agitated by a racist, replying, "The Chinese are not chinks. There is nothing bad about being Chinese." I'd say this is as felicitous as the above, but I also think it violates semantic norms (don't use 'chink' unless you think poorly of the Chinese) to get a good point across. It seems to me that some of Väyrynen's examples might similarly elicit intuitions of overall felicity, which might include semantic infelicity as an especially effective form of communication.

So far I've been trying to question some of Väyrynen's reasons for thinking that one can use thick terms with complete semantic propriety while blocking the associated global evaluations. Let me add that I am more impressed than Väyrynen seems to be by the fact that it is very hard to come up with even controversial cases of defeasibility. Väyrynen focuses on 'whether or not' clauses: "Whether or not Madonana's show is lewd . . ."; "Whether or not he is either [chaste or unchaste]" (80).

But if the global evaluations are non-semantic implications like generalized conversational implicatures or presuppositions, as Väyrynen maintains, they should be more easily cancelable than this.

Consider these two sentences:

6. He had a drink at the party, but I do not mean to suggest he had an alcoholic drink (cf. 132).

7. Madonna's show is lewd, but I do not mean to suggest it is bad in any way distinctive of explicit sexual display.

Whereas 6seems appropriate to me, 7seems infelicitous. (Väyrynen would agree with my judgment about 7(see 104).) That is hard to explain if the implications are like generalized conversational implicatures (or pragmatic presuppositions) in both cases.

Of course, Väyrynen can and does maintain that the form of pragmatic implication for thick evaluations is non-standard, and perhaps this can account for difficulties with defeasibility. But any move along these lines cuts against the simplicity of his explanation.

So perhaps thick terms pattern more like certain conventional implicatures and less like generalized conversational implicatures. Consider the derogatory term 'Kraut'. The negative evaluation communicated with this term -- something like 'Germans merit contempt' -- seems to project, and it cannot be cancelled. One attractive explanation for this pattern is that the negative evaluation is part of the term's conventional meaning but does not contribute to its truth-conditional content (at least not at-issue truth-conditional content). That is, it is a conventional implicature. If I am right that thick terms pattern in a similar way, this hypothesis is attractive for thick terms, too.

Väyrynen raises a potential problem for the conventional implicature view. For conventional implicatures are typically detachable. A term's implication is detachable when there is a substitute term with the same truth conditional content without that implication. So rather than say 'your cur barked all night last night' one can say the same truth with 'your dog barked all night last night', which lacks the implication that one dislikes dogs (or your dog). By contrast, Väyrynen suggests that, depending on how strictly one applies the test, thick terms might not have sufficiently close truth-conditional substitutes (101-103). If not, you cannot say the same thing you want to say with thick terms minus the implicated global evaluation. Väyrynen concludes that at best this test provides no evidence for the conventional implicature view and might provide evidence against it.

But I think the test cannot provide evidence against the conventional implicature view. It only goes one way: if detachable, that's some evidence of conventional implication. If, by contrast, there are no truth-conditional substitutes for thick terms, and so the global evaluations are non-detachable, that simply shows something about the poverty of our language. We have one way to assert certain truth-conditional content. As far as I can see, non-detachability does not further show that any global evaluations associated with that one way of stating certain truths fail to be conventional implicatures. So I do not see much standing in the way of a conventional implicature view (modulo some tricky issues about projection in intensional contexts).

Before turning to some of the book's other important contributions, it is worth noting that the sort of pragmatic view Väyrynen endorses is very close to conventional implicature views (139-40). Recall that I earlier said one reason he sides with pragmatics is that this seems to employ fewer theoretical posits. No additional semantic properties needed for lexical entries, just familiar conversational norms and background knowledge that thick terms are used only by folks with certain sorts of global evaluative attitudes.

And yet one wants some explanation for why thick terms are statistically used only by those with certain global evaluations. One explanation is that those evaluations are part of the conventional, encoded meaning of the thick term. If we grasp that meaning, that would explain why we only use the term when (we think) the implication is satisfied. Even if that is not the case, at some point the boundary between conventional content and known patterns of usage that don't make it into conventional content gets awfully blurry. One wants a better grip on the importance of any semantic-pragmatic divide when we approach this boundary before taking sides. More on this shortly.

First, let me mention a couple of Väyrynen's defensive moves in favor of the Pragmatic View. He considers whether we need semantic evaluative content to help determine the extensions of thick terms, or to account for the shapelessness of thick extensions (chs. 7 and 8).

Concerning shapelessness, Väyrynen works with the following shapelessness thesis:

(ST) The extensions of evaluative terms and concepts aren't unified under independently intelligible nonevaluative relations of real similarity, not even as a matter of synthetic a posteriori truth that isn't settled by the meanings of evaluative terms or concepts (190).

The stated aim for Väyrynen is then to show how extensions for various terms can be shapeless in this sense (i.e., the shape cannot be understood except through some grasp of the relevant term) even when the terms are non-evaluative. Väyrynen suggests mental terms provide examples of shapelessness (192-93). For such terms it is plausible that the extensions cannot be understood as a sensible grouping of similar things in mental-free terms. Yet these aren't evaluative terms at all. So it looks like we do not need evaluative semantic content to help explain the phenomena, and it looks like the interesting consequences of shapelessness (concerning autonomy, non-naturalism, particularism) might not be consequences of the phenomena after all.

Even supposing Väyrynen is right about all this, it can be tough to tell how it bears on his Pragmatic View. If I were to put shapelessness into service against the Pragmatic View, it would go something like this:

a.     The extensions of thick terms have a shape at all only if i) that shape is given/revealed in thickness-free terms or ii) that shape is given/revealed by the (global) evaluative semantic content of the thick terms.

b.     The extensions of thick terms have a shape.

c.     That shape is not given/revealed in thickness-free terms.

d.     So, thick terms have (global) evaluative semantic content.

Väyrynen might resist the first premise by saying we have overlooked at least one option: the shape is given/revealed by non-evaluative aspects of thick semantics. That might be. By pointing to the mental as a partner in crime, one gestures at this possibility. But the fact that the mental gets its shape without evaluative help is not evidence that the thick gets its shape without evaluative help. Perhaps mental terms are functional terms, and functional profile gives those categories shape that cannot be seen in non-functional terms. But are qualities describable in thick terms generally functional? I doubt it. And unless we have an argument that the way in which the mental is given shape is analogous to the way in which the thick is given shape, this plausible hypothesis remains: thick terms get their shape -- a shape that cannot be seen in thick-free terms -- through evaluative content.

Finally, let me note how much I learned about the significance, or lack thereof, for thick terms in general metaethical debates (chs. 1 and 10). One of Väyrynen's points is that thick terms have less significance than often supposed when it comes to fact-value distinctions, objectivity, arguments against expressivism, reasons for action, etc. Indeed, if the Pragmatic View is correct, this seems to follow. But Väyrynen's insightful discussions of these matters did more than that -- they helped me see how problematic the arguments are from thick terms to these other conclusions regardless of whether the Pragmatic View is correct.

Clearly, this is a rich book that deserves careful study. As you can tell from all my comments, reading it was a thought-provoking education. And though I might not have said it yet, you get the idea: these things make the book not just good, but superb.