The Life of the Mind: An Essay on Phenomenological Externalism

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McCulloch, Gregory, The Life of the Mind: An Essay on Phenomenological Externalism, Routledge, 2003, 176pp, $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415266238.

Reviewed by Anne Jaap Jacobson , University of Houston


Some philosophy books and articles concentrate on the arguments for or against a certain position, while others place their initial emphasis more on the conditions of adequacy on any theory in the relevant area. The Life of the Mind: An Essay on Phenomenological Externalism takes the latter approach. While it is markedly engaged with traditional arguments in Anglophone philosophy of mind, it also works with overall guiding principles for a theory of mind. The result is a valuable book, one to be read with profit both by professors and students.

The Life of the Mind presents a reconceptualization of the place of the mind in the world. In a far-reaching way it challenges the binary oppositions that many recent continental thinkers have found in Anglophone philosophy, such as that between mind and world. The project is surprisingly articulated in the context of a literature that seemingly enacts a disembodied philosophy. Recent preoccupation with merely possible worlds, as in the Twin Earth literature on which McCulloch draws extensively, hardly seems to lead to an increased sense of one’s embodiedness.

The structure of the book is misleadingly simple. Hence, readers unfamiliar with McCulloch’s work should take Tim Crane’s valuable introduction seriously; it serves as an excellent guide to the rest of the book. As Crane tells us, a possible epigraph for the book is the demand articulated by John McDowell that the ’life of the mind should not be made unrecognizable’ when one theorizes about content. Restoring to us a recognizable life of the mind is a central task of the book. For McCulloch recognizability of the right sort requires three very general theses (p. 1):

  • phenomenology, the idea that it is like something to have a mind;
  • externalism, the idea that ’the mind ain’t in the head’;
  • the epistemological Real Distinction, the idea that knowledge of minds as such is different in kind from that delivered by the physical science.

The impact of the book comes as all three are put together. However, the specific claims on behalf of each and their interrelations in the theory make all the difference. Thus, for example, McCulloch argues for extending the usual understanding (at least in Anglophone philosophy) of “phenomenological” to include non-sensory, intentional states and activities such as thinking. Nor is this simply a technical point; in conjunction with his other claims, it will enable him to present a picture of our intentionality as phenomenologically available to others in our actions.

In addition, the externalism is no mere externalism. It becomes “behavior-embracing mentalism,” a view that holds that activities of the body are the primary bearers of content (p. 12). With it the author is in the company of other recent authors such as Hubert Dreyfus, Susan Hurley, Alva Noe, Shaun Gallagher and Sean Kelly, all of whom are working to construct alternatives to a scientific Cartesianism.

McCulloch’s behavior-embracing mentalism is based on both Putnamian and Wittgensteinian considerations. There have been some complaints in the literature about his attempts to wed the two very different philosophers. To put it in terms employed above, Twin Earth conclusions about content and essence seem to fall very short of the picture of embeddedness that McCulloch wants. He is unrepentant, though he addresses critically the central alternatives to the Wittgensteinian conclusions he draws from Twin Earth cases.

McCulloch also argues for an epistemological Real Distinction. The ’epistemological’ is in contrast to a Cartesian ontological real distinction between mind and body. The ontological distinction is in some ways McCulloch’s stalking horse; it provides the underpinnings of many of the erroneous ways of thinking that the book seeks to defeat. He maintains that the two real distinctions are fully separable; one can have either without the other.

According to the epistemological real distinction, in Collingwood’s version, understanding another as a thinker requires re-enactment of his or her thoughts. “ … [T]hinking, conceiving, doubting and so on can occur as conscious (and shareable) phenomena” (p. 101). In knowing what others think we do get their thoughts into our minds; an account of the neurons’ activity is not even a good candidate for a substitute.

The three principle ingredients of McCulloch’s philosophy of mind – phenomenology, externalism and the epistemological Real Distinction - are put fairly quickly into place in what McCulloch deems a more constructive first part of the book. The picture that one gets is clearly that of a self-in-the-world, one for which the usual bifurcations of mind and world, self and other, and sensory and cognitive either disappear or are reconceived into a much mitigated form. This is valuable philosophy.

Though some recent philosophers, notably Paul Churchland, are criticized in the first half of the book, the second half of the book is, according to the author, more destructive. It offers critiques of various opposing pictures. Some of the usual suspects appear. Quine’s behaviorism is rejected; Davidson’s views are modified. Twin Earth is revisited; Fodor and McGinn’s views are subjected to acute scrutiny. More particularly, a bipartism, which underpins much that is said these days about the computational theory of mind (with its peripheral inputs and outputs), is tellingly contrasted with a tripartism that is characterized as originating with Frege. One cannot, it is claimed, understand thinking in terms merely of mental representation and causal relations; there is something “in between” which is sought in the Fregean conception of intentionality. McCulloch distinguishes importantly between behavior-as-phenomenologically-available (i.e., behavior-as-interpreted) and behavior as bodily movements. Our actions are phenomenologically available to others and our intentionality is manifest. Tripartism allows us to accommodate such features of our lives.

The book is not perfect. In McDowell style, it takes scepticism as the principle motivating factor in the development of Cartesianism. Today many, and quite likely most, historians of the period disagree. The skeptical stance of the First Meditation, with the accompanying detachment of the mind from the body, is not the principle motivation for the Cartesian picture of the mind, as Margaret Wilson, among others, has effectively argued. In his Synopsis to the Meditations, Descartes tells us that the First Meditation is to help detach the mind from the senses, but his motivation for wanting to do that is independent of the skeptical method he employs. He is rather, as his reference to the senses indicates, concerned with understanding the place of mind in a world newly revealed to be bereft of many of the traditional sensory qualities.

Unlike many of the recent authors resisting Cartesianism (and cited above), McCulloch does not strongly take account of recent empirical research. This is a book in analytic philosophy, as that has been understood over the last half century. At times the remoteness from the empirical is jarring. For example, he tells us, “… [I]f you could undergo a medical operation to equip you with sonar, then you would notice that the world seems different on account of a new sensitivity to certain properties, and you would acquire the corresponding concepts in the process” (p. 34). Given the lack of success some people have with cochlear implants, this claim looks just wrong. There is elaborate processing that goes on between sensory input and concepts, and, equally, success can depend on ways in which one grows and develops. McCulloch’s work presents foundational reasons for taking the body seriously, and it might itself have been enriched by taking the empirical more seriously, controversial though that thought is among Wittgensteinians.

Finally, the argumentation too often accepts conclusions too easily. For example, the important Real Distinction is based partly on observations that in a particular case “there is no reason to suppose that learning the physical breakdown of these humans will give us their concepts … “. Sympathetic as one may be to the conclusion, the premises seem infected by a parochial appeal to what we now can recognize as reasons.

The flaws are small, however, compared to the foundational nature of the inquiry. The physicalist isolationism of the brain-in-the-vat scenario is thoroughly put to rest. Though itself not much engaged with recent empirical research, the book can provide a framework for understanding both important contributions of, and important restrictions on, the conclusions to be drawn from, such research. As the blurbs say, the book is distinctive and original, ambitious and bold. It is clear that those who knew Gregory McCulloch will miss him greatly. I would expect that those who did not meet him before his early death will, like me, wish they had had the chance.