The Limits of Blame: Rethinking Punishment and Responsibility

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Erin I. Kelly, The Limits of Blame: Rethinking Punishment and Responsibility, Harvard University Press, 2018, 229pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674980778.

Reviewed by Christopher Heath Wellman, Washington University in St. Louis


This book offers a comprehensive challenge to the retributivist conviction that our criminal legal institutions are justified because they mete out the suffering deserved by morally blameworthy wrongdoers. Erin I. Kelly does not merely contend that retributivists cannot justify anything like our existing penal practices, she offers subtle and sophisticated arguments of moral and political philosophy in defense of her striking conclusion that our inclination to blame should play no part in criminal law.

To begin, it is worth noting why retributivism is so attractive. Punishment is typically reserved for those who are duly convicted of committing a bad act (actus reus) with a guilty mind (mens rea). If one did nothing wrong, or if one's wrongdoing was entirely excused, then no one would recommend punishment. But if one deliberately violated someone else's rights, for example, then a negative response seems appropriate. According to retributivism, not only is it permissible to punish culpable wrongdoers, we have positive moral reasons to do so. One way of putting the core retributivist position is to assert that the world is a better and more just place when those who are morally culpable are condemned and given the hard treatment they deserve.

A central component of Kelly's book is her penetrating critique of the idea that our existing criteria of legal guilt map neatly onto any plausible sense of moral blame. In other words, even if the retributive thesis articulated above is acceptable in theory, it would not justify anything remotely like current legal institutions in countries like the United States. Some of the problems with the status quo are familiar to those acquainted with the relevant literature. Two glaring issues are overcriminalization (when people are convicted for behavior -- like recreational drug use -- that is not actually morally wrong) and excessive and/or inhumane punishment (when those convicted are incarcerated for indefensibly long periods in brutally oppressive and psychologically debilitating conditions). But Kelly notes other elements which often garner much less attention, such as the fact that "courts have thrown out racial discrimination as a basis for challenging criminal conviction and sentencing -- for the perverse reason that such discrimination is too common." (p. 8) It is also problematic that many of those actually caught up in our criminal legal system are among the most economically disadvantaged and the least psychologically healthy. Regarding the former, Kelly writes that

People should not be burdened with serious, harmful consequences for breaking the law when they have been deprived of a reasonable opportunity to lead a satisfactory, law-abiding life. Social injustice undermines legitimate law enforcement and dooms prospects for achieving justice through criminal law. (p. 15)

And regarding the latter, she urges that

The criminal law is indifferent to individual capacities partly because it does not want to invite defendants to argue, as some surely would, that they are morally dense or unmoved by moral reasons, thereby leaving jurors to sort out whether such claims are true, on a case by case basis. In other words, it is sometimes by design, rather than by accident -- or viciousness or racism on the part of judges and legislatures -- that criminal law's specification of the conditions under which one is subject to legal punishment departs from morality's specification of when a person can be blamed. (p. 38)

Moreover, while retributivism dictates that a criminal's blameworthiness is a function of both how badly one acts and how pernicious one's mental state is, Kelly notes that the U.S. Supreme Court upheld a sentence of twenty-five years to life in prison for stealing three golf clubs because it was the defendant's so-called "third strike." (p. 17) And regarding a defendant's mental state, Kelly claims that

Most morally disabling forms of mental illness, including significant impairments to moral motivation, empathy for others, and the like, are not recognized as legal defenses. Thus, a person who is not morally blameworthy can properly (so far as the law is concerned) be found guilty of criminal wrongdoing. The mental or circumstantial obstacles she faces may excuse her from moral blame, even though her intentional behavior violates criminal laws and renders her eligible for punishment. (p. 80)

An obvious rejoinder for the retributivist would be to concede that her theory does not justify the status quo, but this just shows that we must reform our existing criminal legal systems. For multiple reasons, however, Kelly contends that this move is unavailable to retributivists.

First of all, Kelly argues that we must know much more than that an individual is minimally competent before we assign blame. As she puts it, we should

insist that the mere possibility of right action is not a reasonable basis for moral expectations. Instead, we might maintain that a morally competent individual is someone about whom we can say, not only that it is possible but also that it is substantially likely, that she would act well. (p. 68)

But moving to this more appropriate standard leads to practical and principled issues. When precisely is a person "likely enough" to have acted well? Even if well-trained philosophers and psychiatrists can answer this question, should we feel comfortable with real-world politicians, judges and jurors trying to do so?

Kelly also cautions that we cannot properly assign blame without assessing an agent's motives, but she observes that

It is true that motive is sometimes introduced in the sentencing phase of a criminal trial, although more often as an aggravating than a mitigating consideration. Evidence of cruel or greedy motives can serve to increase the penalty, according to some sentencing guidelines. Overall, however, the legislation of mandatory sentences and other restrictions on judicial discretion counter efforts to individualize sentences in response to a defendant's motives, and motive has increasingly come to be treated as irrelevant to sentencing, at least in the United States. (p. 105)

And third, Kelly warns that justifying our criminal legal practices with retributivism runs afoul of the requirements of public reason. As she puts it,

Blame as a response to wrongdoing contains an element of personal choice. It is morally optional, at least in many places, and people who engage in it do so in a personal way. By contrast, the rules of criminal justice apply coercively to all members of society, and legal rules should be supported by public reasons -- reasons that all members of society should accept. But since there are morally serious perspectives that do not require blame as the appropriate moral response to wrongdoing, the institutions of criminal justice should not mandate public blame. Moral blame does not provide us with public reasons for criminal punishment. (p. 102)

Others are more conversant with the public reason literature than I, but I think Kelly's very interesting argument runs as follows. We should accept something like what Rawls calls "the liberal principle of legitimacy," which requires that political coercion must not be imposed upon constituents for reasons that they can reasonably reject.[1] This edict is problematic for a state's practice of blaming because people may reasonably prefer not to blame wrongdoers, especially when the wrongdoers have endured serious hardships. So when the state takes it upon itself to blame all convicted criminals, it disrespects the autonomy of the victims of these crimes who might reasonably decide not to blame those who have wronged them. It would not be objectionable if our criminal legal institutions put victims in a position to blame those who wronged them, but our criminal legal system goes far beyond this. It elects to blame all convicted criminals, which denies the victims of the personal decision of whether or not to do so.

Given all of these problems, one would not be surprised if Kelly recommended abolishing our criminal legal institutions. She believes that we are not at liberty to do so, however, because the state is obligated to protect the equal rights of its citizens. We should mend, not end, criminal law, and the chief change is that punishment should be act-focused. In particular, Kelly recommends a principle of "just harm reduction," which criminally prohibits citizens from wrongfully harming one another without necessarily blaming those who do break the law. She writes,

A legitimate democratic state must defend, with fair defensive measures, the equal rights of all citizens. But it does not need to blame people who are found criminally guilty in order to take measures to do so. Furthermore, the moral basis of a state's permission to burden criminal wrongdoers with punishment does not license its morally righteous condemnation of them. It is enough that it criticize, even condemn, their criminal acts. Punishment can and should remain act-focused. Doing without blame fits better with the actual basis of criminal liability in criminal law. (p. 121)

Justice requires that none of us should be liable to punishment unless we voluntarily act contrary to the law, so Kelly's view is like retributivism in that it insists those who do no wrong must not be punished. But because her position is act-focused, the criminal sanction takes no stand on whether the person who committed the crime is blameworthy. In short, we need to penalize criminals in order to protect the equal rights of all citizens, but we emphatically do not need to blame anyone, which is a good thing since effectively reducing wrongful harm requires us to penalize many more folks than those few who are genuinely morally blameworthy. In the end, then, Kelly recommends that we transform criminal law so that it is much more like tort law. In tort law, the state can demand that the tortfeasor must compensate a victim without morally condemning the former in any way. Similarly, Kelly believes that our criminal legal institutions can and should mete out sanctions without morally blaming the person who is punished. And if we focus on acts and abandon our practice of blaming persons, perhaps we will be less inclined to unreflectively confine criminals in cages and to continue to shun them after they have served their prison sentences.

There is obviously a great deal to like about this book, but I can imagine a retributivist questioning the morality of moving to an exclusively act-focused approach to criminal law. As Kelly acknowledges, it is largely taken for granted that we all begin with a weighty right against being subjected to hard treatment. The retributivist will insist that individuals forfeit this right only if they commit a bad act (actus reus) with a guilty mind (mens rea). Is Kelly really suggesting that, as long as we do not blame those we punish, we are free to mete out hard treatment to those who commit bad acts regardless of whether or not they acted with guilty minds? Either answer to this question appears problematic. If Kelly is not really dispensing with mens rea, then her approach is not truly act-focused, and it is not clear to what extent she is offering a genuine alternative to retributivism. If she is comfortable doing away with mens rea, however, then many will worry that her harm reduction strategy is not as just as she claims.

Another way to put this point is in terms of culpability. Many believe that we retain our right against being punished as long as we do not act culpably. Is Kelly suggesting that criminal law (like tort law) need not concern itself with culpability? If she is comfortable recommending that defendants may be convicted whether or not they are culpable, then retributivists (among others) will no doubt protest that her proposal is just as prone as deterrence theory to lead to rights violations. If Kelly wants to distance herself from deterrence theorists and insist that culpability is required for punishment to be permissible (and there is some evidence for this, both because she specifies that "Each of us has a basic right that our vulnerability to criminal sanctions depend on our voluntary behavior" (p. 129, emphasis added) and because (on p. 132) she criticizes deterrence theorists for being insufficiently deferential of individual's moral rights), then her approach does not appear to be exclusively act-based.[2] But if Kelly is recommending that we impose criminal penalties upon only those who are culpable, why must we refrain from blaming those we punish? Perhaps Kelly is right that we should refrain from globally condemning those who break the law, but the retributivist will note that we don't incarcerate acts; we put actors in prison, and there is nothing wrong with blaming culpable actors for their bad acts. In sum, retributivists will insist that those who are not blameworthy have a right not to be punished, but there is nothing wrong with blaming culpable wrongdoers for their wrongdoing.

Retributivists might also question Kelly's invoking public reason. This response could come in retail or wholesale form. The retail version does not deny that the state must not coercively impose itself upon its constituents without offering reasons that cannot be reasonably rejected, but it contests Kelly's claim that one could reasonably reject the idea that culpable wrongdoers should be morally condemned and subjected to proportionate hard treatment. Or more minimally, retributivists might insist that their premises are no more vulnerable to reasonable rejection than those to which Kelly helps herself in constructing her alternative theory. Kelly confidently asserts that

people concerned to formulate laws that meet public standards of justification would endorse a principle of just harm reduction that permits the application of criminal sanctions to prevent and to remedy the violations of rights and other important collective interests, at least when any harm imposed on wrongdoers does not greatly exceed the harm they have caused. (p. 131)

It is far from self-evident, though, that this claim would pass the public reason test while retributivism would not.

More generally, a retributivist might simply question why we must restrict ourselves to so-called public reasons. According to a retributivist of this stripe, what ultimately matters is not whether one can reasonably reject whether convicted criminals deserve to be blamed but whether they in fact merit this condemnation. If culpable wrongdoers are blameworthy, then there is nothing wrong with the state's blaming them (even if some people could reasonably deny that they are blameworthy, or reasonably prefer not to blame them). And in defense of this wholesale rejection of public reason, the retributivist might plausibly submit that far more people on the street would affirm that culpable wrongdoers are blameworthy than would affirm Rawls's liberal principle of legitimacy.

In response, Kelly might stress that her view of criminal law remains importantly distinct from tort law insofar as the former involves more demanding criteria of wrongfulness. She might also counter that, while criminal law should certainly include excusing conditions, these cannot be as sensitive to each individual's history and current situation as would be required to assign moral blame. I am not sure how satisfying retributivists will find these responses, but we do not need to wait to assess the discussion this book will provoke to know that this book accomplishes at least three extremely important tasks: (1) it demonstrates that we should be outraged at the grave injustices perpetrated by our current criminal legal institutions, (2) it provides subtle and sophisticated moral and political philosophical arguments that retributivism must be rejected on principled grounds, and (3) it supplies an original vision of how and why we should rethink and reform criminal law. Regardless of how subsequent debates with retributivists unfold, this book is an extraordinarily impressive contribution to some of the most difficult and pressing conversations we are currently having in moral, political and legal philosophy.

[1] John Rawls, Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1993).

[2] It should be noted, though, that on page 127 Kelly explicitly rejects weak retributivism, the view that it is morally impermissible to punish those who do not deserve it.