The Limits of Free Will

Placeholder book cover

Paul Russell, The Limits of Free Will, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190627607.

Reviewed by Robyn Repko Waller, Iona College


Paul Russell's book is a greatest-hits collection with two main strands: a critical account of how the moral responsibility debate has proceeded from Hobbes to post-Strawson and a positive account of what the compatibilist strategy ought to be. Both strands can be characterized in terms of the ongoing struggle between the 'optimist' and the 'pessimist' regarding moral responsibility, with strong ties throughout to Strawson's legacy of "Freedom and Resentment." The optimist here is broadly the compatibilist who does not take determinism to threaten free and moral agency. The pessimist here is anyone who worries that determinism limits our moral agency in significant respects -- typically, albeit not exclusively, the incompatibilist. What is illuminating and skillful about the collection is, first, how Russell ties these optimist and pessimist positions to the historical literature in philosophy and, second, weaves a hybrid optimist-pessimist compatibilism via his critical discussion of contemporary accounts.

The collection is likely to be of interest to those familiar with both the contemporary and history of philosophy literature on free will and moral agency, especially Humeans and Strawsonians. Moral skeptics will find rich material proposed as a counter to their strong pessimism about moral practices. What stands out especially about this collection is the way in which Russell marries matters of fate and luck with our conception of ourselves as agents more broadly beyond the moral realm. Although all the chapters are self-standing, the collection can be alternatively comprehended holistically as building to a distinctive compatibilist view of moral responsibility, with strong Strawsonian roots and a striking leaning toward the pessimistic attitude of our ability for self-determination as agents.

Russell divides the twelve chapters into four parts. I will follow this grouping in my summary of the content and themes, and will focus developed commentary for select chapters.

Chapter 1 and 2 are the earliest of Russell's work, but each speaks to themes that resonate with advancements in the free will debate since their publication. These articles target historical free will accounts and those advanced in 1980's and 1990's. However, many of the same objections articulated here by Russell have lasting importance for event-causal incompatibilist accounts developed since.

"Sorabji and the Dilemma of Determinism" (Ch. 1) is a criticism of Richard Sorabji's event-causal libertarian account. On Sorabji's view, mental states can serve as causes of free action without necessitating action. Russell worries about Sorabji's dismissal of the comparative question, which asks about the agent's capacity to determine one's will. Russell argues that without addressing the comparative question, the libertarian won't be satisfied that we have secured sourcehood, or self-determination, and compatibilists will worry about luck. Russell notably adds a 2016 addendum in which he applies his assessment to Kane's event-causal libertarianism. Given the resurgence of these topics in the literature, especially the luck problem and contrastive explanation, this chapter is an important contribution.

"Causation, Compulsion, and Compatibilism" (Ch. 2) takes a critical look at the empiricist compatibility strategy, or the compatibilist free will strategy related to positions of Hume and Hobbes. Russell distinguishes two aspects of the strategy, the compulsion argument, ala Hobbes, and the regularity argument. Although the chapter was published in the 1980's, it holds relevance for the more recent literature on bypassing and for neo-Humean free will accounts.

Chapters 3 through 6 address broadly Strawsonian themes, with a focus on Strawson's naturalistic approach to moral responsibility. Here Russell's aim is a negative one -- to subtly examine Strawson's influential work on moral responsibility as well as important treatments of that work. In addition to its place among the continuing discussion of Strawson's body of work, the chapters usefully situate Russell's adoption of select aspects of the Strawsonian approach to moral responsibility.

In "Strawson's Way of Naturalizing Responsibility" (Ch. 3), Russell addresses Strawson's reply to the Pessimist in "Freedom and Resentment" (F&R). Russell argues that Strawson's naturalistic strategy, or his argument that we cannot, practically, give up our reactive attitudes because they are so ingrained in our human nature, is not a good answer to the incompatibilist -- we might still be disposed to have our reactive attitudes even if we ought to treat them as inappropriate. Further, he contends that this puts the weight on the rationalistic strategy, Strawson's argument that when we attend to excusing and exempting conditions they are not the kind of conditions that determinism threatens. Russell argues that Strawson puts heavy weight on the claim that the pessimist is committed to the abnormal being the norm if determinism obtains, but that that is a misreading of the pessimist project; it is rather whether or not incapacity can become the norm, which is possible. Russell ends with a call for an articulation of what the free will capacity amounts to, given the state of this exchange.

"Responsibility and the Condition of Moral Sense" (Ch. 4) examines the Reason-Sentiment theories, or those theories of moral responsibility which are broadly Strawsonian descendants in the following respects: (1) reactive attitudes are at the core of accounts of our moral responsibility and (2) the (compatibilist) control associated with moral responsibility is rational self-control or reasons-responsiveness. Russell's aim is to explore how those two commitments are related. In particular he argues that there needs to be a tighter connection between the two: part of the conditions for being a morally responsible agent, here being reasons responsive, is that one is prone to the reactive attitudes -- holds oneself and others responsible. That is, moral sentiment is not restricted to actual practice of holding responsible but is part of what it is to be in control of one's actions. If one lacks moral sense, one's grasp and application of moral reasons will be impaired.

This chapter nicely situates how Reason-Sentiment accounts, such as John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza's reasons-responsive account and R. Jay Wallace's normative interpretation, have developed in order to fill the gap in Strawson's view of specifying the compatibilist moral capacity that is lacking when one is exempt from reactive attitudes.

In "Moral Sense and the Foundations of Responsibility" (ch.5), Russell returns to a critical assessment of Strawson's F&R itself. He addresses Strawson's "pragmatic argument", that given the "god-like" choice to abandon our reactive attitudes, we ought to weight the effects on our human lives. Here Russell argues that gains or losses to human life as we know it may well be an irrelevant or inappropriate consideration for the decision as to whether to abandon the participant stance, assuming one is making a godlike choice.

In the second half of the chapter, Russell highlights how, despite any shortcomings of Strawson's arguments in F&R, the paper itself has laid the groundwork for the development of fuller accounts of being and holding responsible. In particular, Russell articulates the Kantian and Strawsonian strands of Wallace's rational self-control account and defends Wallace's view from Angela M. Smith's challenge of the distinction between blameworthiness and conditions for appropriate blame. However, Russell is critical of the fact that Wallace's account of moral agency, or being responsible, is independent of the operation of moral sentiment. Hence, here too Russell builds a positive view of moral responsibility in which there is a tight connection between being and holding responsible via the role that capacity for reactive attitudes plays in being a moral agent. Russell concludes with a brief introduction to his "critical compatibilism", a compatibilism that is broadly Strawsonian but recognizes the limits of our moral agency.

Russell continues his critical assessment of Wallace's view in "Responsibility, Naturalism, and 'The Morality System'" (ch.6). Russell finds much to admire about Wallace's critical modifications to Strawson's theory, including Wallace's proposal of a more fine-grained account of the reactive attitudes. Nevertheless, Russell argues against the narrow construal of moral reactive attitudes as tied solely to violations of moral obligation and so exclusively negative and local.

Part III of the collection continues to deliver an impactful bridging and critical commentary of historical and contemporary work concerning moral agency and agency more broadly.

"Practical Reason and Motivational Skepticism" (Ch. 7) concerns Humean skepticism about practical reason. Russell first outlines and critically assesses Christine Korsgaard's criticism of Humean motivational skepticism and her internalist Kantian account of pure practical reasons. Notably, Russell stops short of endorsing a Humean view of practical reason and motivation but instead argues that skepticism about motivation -- how reasons "move the agent" -- is a problem that any account of practical reason needs to substantially address.

"Free Will, Art, and Morality" (Ch.8) pursues an intriguing discussion of the value of being an agent in human life apart from moral agency -- where humans qua agents are producers of value beyond the moral, such as aesthetic and athletic value, via our free actions. Russell looks specifically at the analogy between morality and art: Do incompatibilist concerns about the place of human agents in the natural order and corresponding limits to their agency have any relevance to humans qua artists? Russell argues that the analogy is an apt one in important respects, given similar forms of evaluation in each domain, and has both positive implications for compatibilism but also supports luck objections to free will. It would have been interesting if Russell had addressed the analogy between arts (and athletics) and morality with regard to negative evaluations here as well.

In "Selective Hard Compatibilism: Manipulation and Moral Standing" (Ch. 9), Russell returns to Reason-Sentiment accounts of moral responsibility. Here he examines one prominent version of the manipulation argument against such compatibilist accounts of moral capacity, concerning covert control that does not impair the rational capacities of the agency but yet influences or dictates how rational agency is exercised. He compares such cases of manipulation to the "normal case" of rational agency and characterizes the operation of rational agency in ordinary circumstances as luck-infested -- luck regarding which rational mechanism is operative and how that mechanism is exercised. Russell contrasts this with the proposed advantage that libertarians have -- even if the agent's libertarian rational capacities have been implanted, how those capacities are exercised are not up to the manipulator. Hence, it is possible to have libertarian free will even if one has been manipulated in this way.

What's especially insightful, and of great interest to the now burgeoning literature on manipulation and standing to blame, is Russell's "selective hard compatibilism": Although it may well be that a manipulated agent can act freely and is an apt target of the moral responsibility practices, still, the manipulator, or "controller", lacks standing to blame the manipulated or "controlled" agent.

This tack utilizing standing to blame conditions is a coherent one. However, it appears at the very least to distance being a responsible agent from holding agents responsible in ways that Russell appears to reject in his earlier treatment of Smith's distinctions -- e.g., his objections to a number of standing to blame conditions (p. 85). There Russell argued that we should worry about the conceptual possibility of a world in which beings are responsible agents (in the candidacy sense) but it is not appropriate for any being to blame or praise said agent. Notably, intentional influence on development of our rational capacities and our behavior is a pervasive and mundane feature of the social world. Hence to avoid his earlier articulated worries, Russell would need to at least specify the conditions under which an intentional influence is controlling in the relevant way and further the conditions under which that controller lacks standing to blame. He relies on the notion of "covert control", but this isn't developed in detail. Nevertheless, the chapter is an important contribution to and so of interest to those working on manipulation, both regarding free will and theological issues alike.

The final section, Part IV, takes up once again the Pessimist view of moral responsibility, albeit in contemporary form. Russell's intent is to construct, from his critical stance towards extant compatibilism and moral skepticism, a compatibilist account of moral responsibility that is broadly Strawsonian but recognizes the limits of human agency.

In "Compatibist-Fatalism: Finitude, Pessimism, and the Limits of Free Will" (Ch. 10), Russell develops in detail the kinds of limits of human agency that he contends must be accommodated by a theory of free will and moral responsibility. He outlines and entertains a substantive compatibilist proposal that takes seriously the existence of moral luck and the lack of ultimate responsibility but maintains a place for free and responsible agency in human life. Specifically, Russell characterizes "compatibilist-fatalism", a kind of compatibilist view that concedes that determinism precludes sourcehood or origination of our moral character and actions. In short, this metaphysically modest compatibilism actively recognizes that fate, so conceived, limits both our moral and broader agential scope. Moreover, in reply to those who argue that the condition of ultimate sourcehood is conceptually incoherent and undesirable, Russell deftly replies that a desire for ultimate sourcehood can still be grounded in our recognition that there is something unsettling about a lack of self-origination, comparing this to the desire for immortality in the face of the threat of mortality. Hence, Russell strongly counsels the need to face up to, yet not despair over, the pessimistic facts regarding our agency.

In "Pessimists, Pollyannas, and the New Compatibilism" (Ch. 11), Russell offers an illuminating taxonomy of pessimist worries regarding free will and moral responsibility. Specifically, he surveys Daniel Dennett's account of free will and moral responsibility, a prominent 'optimistic' compatibilist account. Given that Dennett explicitly aims to quell incompatibilist fear and dread about determinism, this discussion neatly follows arguments in the previous chapter against the optimistic compatibilists more generally. Russell argues that Dennett's classical compatibilist tack only effectively dispels certain pessimistic concerns, such as whether agents control their actions, but not concerns about freedom of will or sourcehood. Russell concludes, though, that the fundamental issue with Dennett's compatibilism is that it does not answer or take seriously enough the ultimacy concerns of the incompatibilist. This line of argument resonates with Russell's optimist-pessimist hybrid compatibilist view of responsibility.

"Free Will Pessimism" (Ch. 12) serves to articulate Russell's positive view of moral responsibility, critical compatibilism, one with strong threads to earlier critical chapters. What emerges is a compatibilist account that takes seriously the limits of human agency in terms of the role of luck and lack of ultimacy. He terms this commitment "free will pessimism" in contrast with the free will skepticism of moral skeptics who deny that we can be responsible agents of the basis of such limits. Russell beautifully expresses this acceptance of our agential limits as "a (troubling) human predicament that needs to be recognized and acknowledged" (p. 244). At the core of Russell's view is his embrace of Strawsonian naturalism -- the tendency for humans to be subject to reactive attitudes as part and parcel of their nature.

To my mind, the most fundamental challenge for Russell's critical compatibilism is to defend, or qualify, the acceptance of serious retributive treatment and practices (such as sanctions and punishment) given that critical compatibilism explicitly accepts both a backward-looking notion of responsibility and the pessimist concern of ultimacy. While some moral responsibility practices, such as resentment or overt blame, might be justified on his view, ultimacy still threateningly looms over the implementation of more-weighty moral evaluation and treatment. What kinds of justified moral treatment are put in its place on a critical compatibilist view? Russell will likely find this challenge to miss the point: he rejects a narrow understanding of "the morality system" and calls for fairness of practice and in its place takes a Strawsonian line of internal justification of moral responsibility practices (pp. 259-261). However, it seems here that there is at least a neglected critical compatibilist option to maintain commitment to selective retributive practices.

Russell's collection builds a well-constructed bridge for free will and moral responsibility theorists to use, where the historical approaches of Hume, Hobbes, Mill, and others are understood and recast in light of the contemporary structure of the free will debate. The merits of this collection go well beyond being a valuable compendium of critical assessment of contemporary optimism and skepticism about moral responsibility. Russell harnesses decades of reflection on moral responsibility to construct a distinctive yet measured compatibilist alternative, one that acknowledges the limits of human control while upholding the dignity of our moral life.