The Limits of Kindness

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Caspar Hare, The Limits of Kindness, Oxford University Press, 2013, 229pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199691999.

Reviewed by Richard Yetter Chappell, Bowling Green State University


Caspar Hare aims to settle a variety of controversial moral questions -- from the ethics of rescue to the non-identity problem -- by drawing on (hopefully uncontroversial) foundational claims about rationality and minimal decency (or kindness). The book is a pleasure to read: full of striking, original arguments that should prove of great interest to ethicists of all stripes.

Hare starts from the idea that minimal decency requires us to see an improvement in someone's welfare as a (defeasible) reason to prefer the improved state of affairs.[1] This alone is of course not enough to guide us when we face cases that involve conflicting interests (e.g., who to save when we cannot save all, or whether to kill one to save several). The challenge is heightened as Hare grants that distinct people's interests may be incommensurable in a way that gives rise to negatively intransitive preferences (having no preference between A and B, or between B and A+, but preferring A+ to A). So, even if you would prefer to save Andy in 2.5 hours than to save him in 3 hours, you may yet have no preference between saving Andy in 2.5 hours or saving Ben in 3. Further assumptions are required to make any progress on such problems.

Part I addresses "opaque" cases (of rescue, altruistic killing, and the non-identity problem), where you don't know who will be helped or harmed by your choice; you only know general facts -- e.g., that rowing left will save someone in 3 hours, whereas rowing right will save someone else in just 2.5 hours. What should you do? According to Hare'sProspectism, you should prefer the option with the better prospects. If, for all you know, any given person is just as likely to be stranded to the left as to the right, but going right will save whoever is there a half hour sooner, then the prospect of going right is better for everyone: they have an equal chance of being saved either way, but going right gives them the chance of being saved a little more quickly.

If Prospectism is correct, any opaque-conflict case calls for the same decision as an analogous no-conflict case, e.g., where you can either save someone in 3 hours, or else save that same person in just 2.5 hours, and where -- whichever choice you make -- someone else (beyond your rescue range) will die. One may be tempted to tollens this conditional and conclude that Prospectism must be mistaken: surely opaque conflict and no conflict are not normatively equivalent, and we might naturally expect their normative differences to play a role in determining how we ought to act in either situation, such that at least some such pair yields divergent verdicts. Unfortunately this flat-footed objection is not one that Hare considers. Instead he focuses on the abstract theoretical merits and demerits of Prospectism and its competitor, Deferentialism.

According to Deferentialism, you may defer to the judgment of your better-informed self. If you know you would have no preference between saving any given person in 3 hours or a different particular person in 2.5, then even in an opaque case where you are not sure which person is in which situation, still you may maintain your attitude of no preference. That is, after all, the attitude you would take upon learning all the facts. Deferentialism thus sounds very well-motivated. Yet, Hare argues, Prospectism can be motivated by the thought that in our opaque case you have some reason to prefer the shorter route, and no reason to prefer the longer. After all, if the prospects are better for everyone, that surely counts for something. While acknowledging that the choice between Prospectism and Deferentialism is "a difficult, open problem" (50), Hare ultimately favors the former.

The remainder of Part I then puts Prospectism to work in converting an array of controversial opaque-conflict cases into uncontroversial no-conflict cases, yielding broadly utilitarian verdicts about rescue cases, the non-identity problem, and killing one to save several. Hare's use of Prospectism struck me as vaguely reminiscent of how past utilitarianshave used the "veil of ignorance". Hare never mentions the latter heuristic, but it could have been illuminating to briefly explore the commonalities and (especially) to clarify the differences between that traditional approach and Hare's own.

Part II provides the ambitious core of the book, as Hare moves beyond opaque cases and presents his Morphing Argument for a kind of impartiality he calls "anonymous benevolence". Roughly speaking, this amounts to a requirement to prefer outcomes that are distributionally -- i.e., when ignoring real identity, and just comparing the positions of the best off, the second best off, etc., all the way down -- better for some (positions) and worse for none. It's worth flagging what a radical conclusion this is: it rules out any kind of partiality to friends and family. So we must, for example, prefer that better-off people existed in place of our loved ones.

Following Hare, I will first explain his argument in counterpart theoretic terms. Assuming that personal essence is not perfectly fragile, we have counterparts that differ from us (perhaps just very slightly) along any qualitative dimension. They in turn have counterparts that differ yet further from us. So, via a chain of such counterparts, we may eventually be connected to any other possible person, however qualitatively dissimilar to us they may be. Hare calls such a chain of counterparts a Morphing Sequence. A morphing sequence is up-slope if each step along the chain yields an increase in well-being. By minimal benevolence, we must prefer each subsequent world to the one before it. So, by the transitivity of rational preference, we must prefer the last world to the first. The process easily generalizes to yield anonymous benevolence: if the individuals in w1 can be put into 1:1 correspondence with the individuals in wn such that a morphing sequence from each individual in w1 to their analogue in wn can be constructed that is in some cases up-slope and otherwise flat (no change in well-being), then minimal benevolence and the transitivity of rational preference will together entail that we should prefer wn to w1.

Could such a strong conclusion really follow from such weak premises? I have my doubts. Consider a morphing sequence from your Baby to some slightly better off merely possible Stranger. I don't think it's at all clear that minimal decency requires you to prefer each subsequent world along the chain to its predecessor. Consider the last world in the sequence, wi, that contains a counterpart of Baby. It seems that you could reasonably prefer wi to wi+1, on the grounds that only in wi does your beloved Baby exist.[2] (It's true that wi+1 contains a counterpart of the Baby* that exists in wi, but your affections are rooted in your actual Baby, not in her distant counterpart Baby*: if a counterpart of the latter is not a counterpart of your Baby, then you won't have the same special interest in her existence and well-being.)

Hare addresses this objection by replacing talk of preference with talk of active favoring, which is roughly a matter of what the agent would prefer were she agnostic about which world is actual. (Such agnosticism is, Hare claims, a condition of proper deliberation about which world to actualize.) I have two residual concerns about this move.

Firstly, it still isn't clear to me that minimal decency requires us to "actively favor" each successor world to its predecessor in an upslope morphing sequence. This will depend on the subtle question of whether preferences that are reasonably "rooted" in the actual must also be conditional on this world being actual, or whether they may take a more unconditional form. To illustrate: Suppose Amy loves her deaf son Dale, and so would not prefer to instead have had a happier non-deaf son Hamish. Now further suppose that Amy comes to be agnostic about which world is actual: i.e., whether her apparent memories of Dale are accurate, or a delusion implanted by an evil demon when her real son is Hamish.[3] Could Amy reasonably continue to hope that the Dale she seems to remember is her actually existing son? Arguably so. But then it seems Amy could reasonably actively favor a world where D* -- a maximally distant counterpart of Dale -- exists over the subsequent world in the morphing sequence that contains a happier counterpart of D* that is no counterpart of her beloved Dale at all.[4]

My second worry is that, plausibly, "active favorings" could reasonably fail to be transitive. This would follow from a certain kind of person-affecting constraint: Suppose that it's a necessary condition on our being required to choose or favor a certain option (from among our total option set) that this option be better for someone than choosing some other option would be. And grant Hare that we may not choose or favor an option if another available option (containing just the same people) would be better for some and worse for none. Now consider an upslope morphing sequence from person A, through their counterpart B, to B's counterpart C, where C is not a counterpart of A. Grant that we actively favor wB over wA (for A's sake), and wC over wB (for B's sake). Are we thereby committed to actively favoring wC over wA? Not necessarily, according to the person-affecting constraint I've described. If our choice is just between wA and wC, then there is no person better off in the latter than in any other option, so we need not favor it. Even if we actively favor each successive world in the morphing sequence to its predecessor, this merely shows that we're rationally bound to favor the last world over the first one when all of the intermediate worlds are also available options. Since they are generally not, the morphing argument fails.

While Hare doesn't seriously consider such a view as this, he does assert a principle, The Practical Insignificance of Irrelevant Alternatives, that could be used against it. In general, Hare notes, it seems irrational to change your choice based on the addition or removal of an option that you wouldn't have chosen anyway. But this is a special case. According to the person-affecting view I've described, the intermediate stages of the morphing sequence are not irrelevant, because they're essential for our ruling out wA (for example) as a choice that's inconsiderate to A, and for establishing wC as a choice that's better for someone.

For readers who are not enamored of counterpart theory, Hare goes on to re-state his morphing argument in terms of trans-world identity. This is a bit more complicated, so I won't repeat the details here. For now, I just want to draw attention to one particularly interesting feature of Hare's discussion.

Recall that Hare's Morphing Argument starts from the principle that Personal Essence is not Perfectly Fragile: "All people could have been ever-so-slightly different along any natural dimension of qualitative sameness and difference" (101). Interestingly, this principle -- together with the platitude that there are some limits on how qualitatively different we could have been -- implies that our essences are actuality-dependent. For consider a possible world w where I am as different from how I actually am as I could possibly be. Let's say my name in that world is 'R*'. Now entertain the hypothesis that w is actual:[5] On that supposition, by Hare's anti-fragility principle, R* could be ever-so-slightly moredifferent from me along the relevant qualitative dimensions. That is, for all we know a priori, R* (who is actually me) could be someone who (actually) isn't me. While they are actually at the very limit of my essence, on the (actually false but a priori possible) assumption that they are actual, their essence projects further. Identity Theory thus ends up behaving a lot like Counterpart Theory -- a fact Hare takes advantage of in extending his argument to work with either.

I think it's an interesting and under-explored question whether Identity Theorists should embrace this result, or instead hold that identity facts are actuality-independent, such that for all we know the actual world may be one at which we're at the very limit of our essence along some qualitative dimension. I share Hare's sense that this would be a puzzling position to take, but I suspect it may nonetheless appeal to those who want to "take identity seriously". There's something rather deflationary-seeming about Hare's interpretation of essence and identity, after all; as if we started from a counterpart-theoretic perspective and then simply redescribed the world using the language of identity, without really reshaping our underlying metaphysical picture at all.

Part III considers the demands of beneficence. Hare offers a very interesting "dominance"-based argument that you cannot consistently prefer to save the drowning child in Singer's pond without also preferring to save a distant starving child via donating to an effective charity. The argument runs roughly as follows: Imagine a situation in which that starving child 'Ned' was instead drowning in a pond before you, but with lower stakes: his survival would be less pleasant, and his death less painful, than in actuality. Since all else is equal, you must prefer the state of affairs in which you save starving Ned (with a better future) to the imagined state of affairs in which you save Ned from the pond, and you must prefer to leave Ned in the pond than to leave him to a more-painful death from starvation. So, if you prefer to save Ned from the pond than to leave him in the pond, then the only way to avoid cyclical preferences is also to prefer to save him from starvation than to leave him to starve.

Hare intends this argument to establish that four commonly-cited considerations -- physical proximity, psychological salience, unique responsibility, and rarity -- don't make an intrinsic moral difference here after all. Of course, many of these factors are more plausibly of indirect significance. For example, rarity seems relevant insofar as it means that saving nearby drowning children is -- for agents who feel psychological pressure to act consistently over time -- far less burdensome to your future self than accepting responsibility for the distant needy would be. Since most of us are likely to feel such psychological pressure to act consistently over time, the simple dominance argument Hare presents doesn't apply to us: we may reasonably prefer to save Ned from the pond than to save him from distant starvation, if the former type of situation is less likely to recur. But a version of Hare's argument may still succeed if these neglected costs of saving the distant can be balanced out simply by adding more "costs" to saving Ned in the pond case, without altering our judgment that decency requires saving Ned from the pond rather than letting him drown.[6]

Having done my best to try to poke holes in Hare's various arguments, let me conclude by recommending this book whole-heartedly. It's an absolute delight to read, full of fascinating ideas and intricate arguments that are prima facie compelling. Even if one can (after some struggling!) find a way to escape Hare's arguments, the route you're then forced to take may prove illuminating in its own right. While the ideas are probably too difficult (despite the strikingly clear prose) for any but the most advanced undergraduates to comfortably grapple with, it would make an excellent text to base a graduate seminar around. Any moral philosopher with a taste for puzzles should get their hands on a copy immediately.


Thanks to Caspar Hare and Helen Yetter-Chappell for helpful discussion.

[1] Retributivists might hold instead that some welfare improvements, e.g., to the vicious, are worthless or even intrinsically bad -- but then they can simply restrict the scope of Hare's arguments to the population of innocent moral patients.

[2] I first formulated this objection in a blog exchange with Hare on Philosophy, et cetera, though let me also note my indebtedness here to Elizabeth Harman's pioneering work on reasonable attachments to the actual, e.g., in her (2009) "'I'll Be Glad I Did It' Reasoning and the Significance of Future Desires," Philosophical Perspectives.

[3] The idea for this case emerged from discussion with Helen Yetter-Chappell.

[4] Though, as Hare noted in correspondence, this move is complicated by the fact that Amy's attitude here will be internally inexplicable to her: For Amy to actively favor the world containing D* over the next world in the morphing sequence is for her to be disposed to prefer it when agnostic between which of these two worlds is actual, and hence when subjectively certain that the Dale depicted in her memories -- and in whom her preferences are "rooted" -- is non-actual. There is, admittedly, something odd about this. But I'm not sure that this oddity necessarily involves unreasonableness or moral indecency on Amy's part, given that her rooted preference is in fact explained by her love for her actual son (despite her mistaken beliefs).

[5] I originally formulated this in terms of nested counterfactuals, but Hare pointed out that he's only committed to the anti-fragility principle applying to actual people (or people "considered as actual", as 2-D semanticists would say). That is, if we can know that if R* is actual, then he's not at the limit of his essence, but it remains an open question whether if R* had been actual, then he would not then be at the limit of his essence.

[6] Thanks to Hare for suggesting this response.