The Limits of Loyalty

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Simon Keller, The Limits of Loyalty, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 232pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521874618.

Reviewed by John Kleinig, John Jay College, CUNY; and Centre for Applied Philosophy and Public Ethics, CSU


This smart, stimulating, and challenging book is a welcome addition to the relatively sparse philosophical literature on loyalty. That the literature is sparse might, if the book's arguments are accepted, be seen as an appropriate reflection of loyalty's importance, for Simon Keller argues that loyalty per se is neither a value nor a virtue (though he allows that certain loyalties may be valuable and in some instances obligatory). But for those -- such as I -- who believe that loyalty has been unfairly neglected and who accord it a more central moral place, this volume is delightfully provocative.

There are ten chapters, followed by a brief conclusion and an almost perfunctory postscript on the universalist/particularist debate that appears to have been added at the prodding of reviewers. Although I believe that the latter issue deserves a much fuller treatment than it gets here, it is hardly surprising, given Keller's position, that it comes more or less as an afterthought.

Chapter 1 seeks to provide an account of loyalty that does not succumb to the temptation to accept as instances of loyalty only those cases in which it is favorably viewed. For those who treat loyalty as a virtue, that is already a problematic strategy, as it would be were we to give an account of courage or generosity that did not beg the question in their favor. Keller's own characterization of loyalty reflects his approach. His considered position is that:

loyalty is the attitude and associated pattern of conduct that is constituted by an individual's taking [not taking] something's side, and doing so with a certain sort of motive: namely, a motive that is partly emotional in nature, involves a response to the thing itself, and makes essential reference to a special relationship that the individual takes to exist between herself and the thing to which she is loyal. (21)

This account does not come out of the blue but is a result of a sharp and insightful discussion of alternative possibilities. I think, however, that it is quite deficient as an account and that its deficiencies reverberate through the rest of the discussion. I would, for example, place less emphasis on the attitudinal or emotional aspects of loyalty and give more weight to loyalty as a form of conduct -- as perseverance in the expectations associated with a relationship, and perseverance in the face of self-serving temptations to do otherwise. Whereas Keller sees the conduct that goes with loyalty as secondary, I see it as primary. Whether the motive for acting loyally is "partly emotional in nature" seems to me to be a contingent matter: when I take my friend's side because he is my friend, my motivation may or may not be partly emotional. To the extent that it is, it is likely that this will simply reflect the degree to which my connection is itself an emotional one. That such connections often are emotional is simply a reflection of the extent to which we have identified with the object of our loyalty and (I would add) the emotions associated with the temptation to do otherwise.

Chapters 2-6 review three contexts in which loyalty is often shown -- friendship, patriotism, and filial duty. Keller intends them to display how contextually dependent our response to loyalty should be. The loyal demands of friendship are explored in Chapter 2. It is Keller's contention that being a good friend may sometimes require the compromise of one's "epistemic integrity" (25). That is, loyalty in friendship may sometimes require that one have an epistemic bias in the friend's favor that one would not have absent the friendship. Getting clear about the nature of this bias is important and Keller spends a good deal of time arguing that it is likely to be in tension with the epistemic requirement that one's beliefs be responsive only to the evidence. Although Keller goes to pains to show that not every friendship will manifest such a conflict, he nevertheless sees it as an endemic tendency of friendships to compromise epistemic integrity. At one level I have no quarrel with the case study analyses that Keller provides. No doubt friendships can distort judgment, and a loyal friend is unlikely to act in ways that are expected to undermine the relationship. What I find less convincing is the suggestion that loyalty in friendship will tend to involve epistemic compromise. To the extent that it does, I would simply argue that it involves a distorted loyalty. No doubt one can expect one's friend to adopt a principle of charity toward one's efforts -- not a bad principle to exercise in other situations -- but that falls somewhat short of compromising one's epistemic integrity. The difficulty is that what Keller sees as an endemic tendency, I view as a corruption. Loyalty is easily corrupted; it does not follow that it is corrupting, as I think Keller wants to suggest.

Keller is not oblivious to the complexities of friendship, the kind of loyalty it embodies, and the ways in which friendship can go wrong. Indeed, one of the engaging features of the book is the constant dialogue in which Keller engages with his critical self, raising and responding to objections, recognizing that there is more to be said, and so on. Sometimes it makes his argument a bit elusive, as positions are boldly stated and then seemingly chipped away at as the discussion proceeds. The critic is likely to feel that his concerns have been responded to by means of concessions that are not then taken to qualify the original thesis.

That friends are likely to be inclined to epistemic compromise need not be a bad thing, Keller argues. Indeed, the epistemically unwarranted support that a friend sometimes shows is just what one needs to persist in some enterprise. But need one's friends falsely believe what they say in one's support? It is one thing to believe that if one encourages a friend in some activity the encouragement itself might enable the friend to accomplish what he or she would not be able to do without the encouragement. It is another thing not to discourage a friend from trying to do something that one believes that the friend is not capable of doing. It is yet something else to believe that the friend can do something for which there is no objectively good evidence. Keller appears to think that loyalty in friendship will incline one to the last of these. That I dispute.

My diagnosis of Keller's problems here goes back to his contention that loyalty is first and foremost an attitude that then manifests itself in certain actions rather than perseverance in the conditions required by an (intrinsically valued) association in the face of certain inclinations or temptations to jeopardize it. Without the attitudinal account that Keller adopts, the issue of epistemic compromise would not be as pressing. One does not need -- indeed one ought not -- to compromise one's epistemic integrity in friendship. What one ought to do, when one's assessment of the evidence would not be supportive of the friend, is to take some care about whether, when, and how to express those beliefs, whether to the friend or others.

If the epistemic compromise involved in friendship is frequently benign, that involved in patriotism (Chapters 3 and 4) is, Keller argues, usually pernicious: "patriotism is certainly not a virtue, and is probably a vice" (52). This is because the epistemic compromise involved in patriotism "is such as to make it inevitable, or almost inevitable, that a patriotic person will tend to fall into bad faith" (52-53, my emphasis). Note the qualifiers, designed to make the critic work hard to make his criticisms stick. What makes for patriotism's troubling character, Keller claims, is the fact that we have little choice about it. We do not decide which country is ours; we are loyal to it simply in virtue of its being ours. It is a loyalty that we take seriously and seek to justify by reference to certain characteristics it supposedly has. The effect of its unchosen character, Keller believes, is that we have a natural tendency to discount evidence that our country lacks the characteristics to which we appeal in justifying our patriotic attitudes. For it is not those that ground our loyalty but the prior fact that it is ours. The patriot is not inclined to confront the fact that her patriotism is not based on the evidence she adduces or responsive to evidence that bears on it. I have no real quarrel with Keller's account of what a good deal of patriotic loyalty is like. My quarrel is that in revealing how skewed this patriotism is he has somehow shown that patriotic loyalty is not a good thing to have. It is as though a critique of romantic love is sufficient to show the perversity of love. I would agree that patriotism is instilled in us from a very young age and that our patriotism is endlessly manipulated by the powers-that-be (as indeed are many noble virtues). But there is still the question whether having a country as one's own and being committed to its well-being to the extent that one would sacrifice for it is desirable. I think we can go some way to arguing that it is. In significant measure, our flourishing as persons is made possible by the existence of stable polities and rich cultural traditions, a fact that may justify citizens in having a patriotic attachment to the country of their birth. Of course, such may not be the case in respect of oppressive regimes, and even countries that treat their citizens reasonably well probably do so in part because they are also homes to a vigorous "loyal opposition." I think it unfortunate that Keller's account, by focusing on what I see as distorted -- albeit prevalent -- patriotism (often characterized by chauvinism and jingoism), misses an opportunity to advocate for something better. But perhaps that is not surprising, given his initial position on loyalty. If there is any value in liberalism, it is that we are encouraged to take evidence seriously and to be willing to reflect on what we take for granted. That need not be incompatible with trust and an inclination to one view, unless one collapses them into credulity and prejudice. Our patriotism may evolve -- one might hope that it will -- but there may be good reasons for favoring one's country that go beyond those features of it with which we often associate our patriotism. As I've already noted, having asserted and argued his theses Keller has a tendency to pull back, to see the issues as being not so cut and dried. Although this can be a bit frustrating (see, for example, his irenic gloss on patriotism on p. 145), it also adds to the richness of the discussion.

The first of two chapters (5 and 6) on filial duties comprises critical discussions of three attempts to account for them: as debts owed to parents, responses of gratitude for benefactions, and as duties of friendship. Although all three may account for some duties that exist between children and parents, they do not ground any distinctively filial duties. Those, as Keller suggests in Chapter 6, may be understood best by reference to the special goods associated with the parent-child relationship. Though I am broadly sympathetic to the account he provides, his argument seems to work more convincingly when focused on the special goods associated with parenting than when focused on the special goods associated with having parents. More critically, it takes a long time for Keller to move from a general discussion of filial duties to filial loyalty (indeed, only in the last four pages of a fifty page discussion). The chapter on patriotism was not taken up with a general discussion of political obligations, and a discussion of filial loyalty did not require such an extensive discussion of filial obligations. Perhaps the former should have, because one might then have wanted to say of various political goods what Keller eventually says of filial goods: "It is difficult to see how such goods could exist in a relationship that is not characterized by mutual loyalty, and … in one in which the child lacks a strong loyalty to the parent" (140). In the case of family, then, Keller wishes to argue that children have a duty of loyalty to their parents. Although it is understandable, given Keller's heavily psychologized account of loyalty, that he does not do so, it would have been good to see some discussion of the limits to filial loyalty. Was Sukhreet Gabel disloyal to her mother when she testified against her in court? Was David Kaczynski disloyal to his Unabomber brother when he went to the FBI? That said, Keller's discussion is always clear-sighted and engaging.

Given the stage setting of the earlier chapters, it is not surprising that when Keller comes to ask in Chapter 7, "Is loyalty a value? Is loyalty a virtue?" his answer is that it is neither. He does not deny that loyalty can be valuable. Indeed, he goes so far as to say that "we should be very happy that we do not live in a world without loyalty" (145). But loyalty's being valuable does not make it a value. Keller acknowledges that many consider loyalty to have an intrinsic value, as do health and happiness; he contends, however, that whatever we find valuable in loyalty we can have without valuing loyalty. Moreover, our loyalty can be given to causes that are by their very nature objectionable. There is nothing intrinsically valuable about the loyalty of a loyal Nazi. Given the thinness of Keller's understanding of loyalty, this is not surprising. Even so, his conclusion strikes me as questionable: do we want to deny the general value of sincerity, conscientiousness, and generosity because they may be displayed toward inappropriate objects? I think not, though the inappropriateness of their objects may counteract whatever intrinsic value they may have. The way I would see it, loyalty, like generosity or courage, is something to be valued for its own sake, even though its value can be undermined by being associated with evil causes. I have similar reservations about Keller's resistance to the idea that loyalty might be a virtuous character trait. As before, the plausibility of his position depends substantially on the plausibility of his initial understanding of loyalty. Understandably, he is not too sure whether he would want his child to acquire the character trait of loyalty because someone who has that "sounds a little too much like someone who is undiscriminating, and whose emotional attachments to particular entities play too much of a role in determining how she will live her life" (157). Such a conception differs substantially from one in which loyalty is construed as perseverance in an intrinsically valued association in the face of self-interested alternatives. Such loyalty will sometimes go wrong because of ill-chosen associational relations, but it is nevertheless a good trait to acquire.

Chapter 8 addresses a general problem that Keller perceives for his view: communitarian frameworks that are likely to ascribe greater value to loyalty. He offers and critiques four communitarian arguments to that effect: (1) because we are constituted by our membership of various communities, failure to be loyal to them would amount to self-alienation; (2) because our moral consciousness is developed within and articulated through a particular community, failure to develop loyalty to that community will result in moral collapse; (3) people who lack loyalty to their communities are likely to be alienated from themselves and others; and (4) morality is a matter of loyalty to others as members of some group or other. This is not the place to review those arguments. I would suggest, however, that had not Keller's initial conception of loyalty been as thin as it is -- primarily an "emotional attachment" (180) -- some of these communitarian defenses of loyalty would have stood up rather better to Keller's inventive refutations.

It is in Chapter 9 that Keller turns his attention to that pre-eminent of loyalty theorists, Josiah Royce. High on rhetoric but low on detail, Royce sketches an engaging outline of a life devoted to a cause or causes that maximize the possibilities for devotedness, lives that are centered and stable, albeit around a variety of causes. Although it may have been helpful had Keller taken up some of Royce's evolving ideas on loyalty (particularly as expressed in The Hope of the Great Community), his critique of Royce is fresh and sufficiently devoid of the ad hominem argumentation that Royce's discussion attracts to enable him to explore the possibilities of a making loyalty universalist moral principle.

It probably crosses the mind of everyone who reflects on loyalty that disloyalty may be, as J.L. Austin put it, the "trouser word," and Chapter 10 provides Keller with the opportunity to confront the possibility that even if we have a good deal of ambivalence about the value of loyalty, disloyalty is uniformly evil. But though Keller is willing to grant that disloyalty is not "morally inert," he disagrees with those who think that disloyalty is profoundly wrong. Whistle-blowers provide him with the opportunity to argue that it may sometimes be right to be disloyal. The whistle-blower can claim that the company whose confidential information she disclosed "did not deserve [her] loyalty," meaning not that she was "not really disloyal" but that her disloyalty was justified (202). Our intuitions differ. I would want to argue that the whistle-blower would be more inclined to argue that the company had forfeited any claim to her loyalty and that she was not therefore being disloyal. I think, indeed, that this is implicit in the common attempt by whistle-blown companies which, to show the disloyalty of whistleblowers (and therefore their moral wretchedness), seek to associate such whistle-blowing with self-serving or other base motives (discredit the messenger). For what is distinctive about disloyalty and what differentiates the disloyal person are the operative motives for the associational breach. Whereas Keller argues that though dogs can be loyal they are incapable of disloyalty because they are incapable of having the relevant "motives, and a general level of mental sophistication," I would be more inclined to argue that because (I here presume) dogs are not capable of moral responsibility and hence of disloyalty, they also lack the capacity for full-blown loyalty (205-06). Disloyalty, as Keller argues at length, is an affront to a relational expectation, not in a merely predictive but a normative sense. But that normative expectation can be cancelled if the associational other has violated the understanding that underwrote the association (by being unwilling to address its breach of public or other trust). The whistleblower no longer owes it her loyalty. That is not disloyalty, even justified disloyalty. Although I think this counts against Keller's position, it does not do full justice to the complexity and nuance that he displays. Even if I sometimes think the subtlety of his discussion is generated by the implausibility of his claims, it makes for a wonderfully stimulating argument.

Though loyalty is underserved in the philosophical literature, a great deal has nevertheless been written on it. I was, therefore, a bit disappointed that some of the more illuminating contributions to that topic appear to have escaped Keller's notice. Samuel Scheffler's various writings have not only advanced the discussion of patriotism, but have also illuminated the tension between universalism and particularism. Albert Hirschman's Exit, Voice, and Loyalty is a major contribution by a political economist. Terrance McConnell's Gratitude provides not only an excellent discussion of gratitude (which also occupies a fair bit of Keller's attention in Chapter 5) but also has many parallels with loyalty and Keller might have benefited from McConnell's discussion (in particular, because of Keller's tendency to overpsychologize them both).

This review has not been able to do full justice to the intricacy, perspicuity, and even, at some level, to the evenhandedness, of Keller's discussion. Although I find myself at odds with its basic claims, it is just the kind of book with which a critic needs to come to terms. For the moment, it represents the best discussion we have of loyalty.[1]

[1] I thank Simon Keller for comments on a draft of this review. It should not be assumed that he agrees with all my critical remarks.