The Limits of Realism

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Tim Button, The Limits of Realism, Oxford University Press, 2013, 264pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199672172.

Reviewed by Lieven Decock, VU University Amsterdam


Tim Button revisits the battle between realists and antirealists that raged in the 1980s and 1990s and zooms in on Putnam's internal realism. The book is not a historical overview of Putnam's frequent crisp changes in position, but a modern reconstruction of the arguments in the internal-external realism controversy. Button analyzes Putnam's central works from a present-day philosophical perspective, which casts a charming new light on the arguments.

The philosophical scene has changed markedly since Putnam turned towards internal realism in the late 1970s. One of the most indicative changes is that the important Edgar Pierce chair in philosophical psychology in Harvard, Putnam's home department, was at the time occupied by the behaviourist Quine and is now occupied by the neo-phenomenologist Susanna Siegel. This rediscovery of the first-person perspective is visible in Button's work. Whereas Quine's thesis of the inscrutability of reference, proxy-function argument, and philosophical analysis of the Löwenheim-Skolem theorems have clearly inspired Putnam, Quine remains remarkably absent in Button's analysis. Interestingly, Button argues that the basic framework of Putnam's empiricism is to be found in Carnap's Der logische Aufbau der Welt, which just precedes Carnap's conversion from phenomenalism to physicalism. In addition to the rediscovery of first-person phenomenal experience, other recent philosophical developments in epistemology and (meta-)metaphysics and the birth of philosophy of perception as a philosophical discipline in its own right subtly alter the plausibility of some premises. The result is a refreshing new interpretation of Putnam's argumentation.

In the first part Button argues that Putnam's arguments against external realism are vindicated. External realism is characterized by three principles: the independence principle, stating that the world is made up largely of mind-independent objects; the correspondence principle, stating that truth involves a correspondence between words (or other thought-signs) and external things (and sets of external things); and the Cartesianism principle, stating that even an ideal theory might be radically false. Button illustrates with a minimum of technicality (but with a clear command of the finer logical details) how the model-theoretic treatment leads to unintended interpretations. He scrutinizes Putnam's just-more-theory manoeuvre and argues at length that all attempts to constrain the reference relation must necessarily lack empirical content; only magical theories of reference invoking mechanisms such as 'medieval essentialism,' 'noetic rays,' 'divine intervention,' etc., might single out a unique intended interpretation. Central in Button's analysis is the 'bracketed' empiricist view; empirical content is believed to be first-person, private, bracketed experience. Various sceptical veils separating experience from the external world are discussed, and it is argued that all seal off the external world from first-person experience in a way that the indeterminacy argument becomes insurmountable. Hence, the model-theoretic argument and the just-more-theory manoeuvre convert a 'Cartesian angst,' i.e., the worry that appearances may be deceptive, inexorably into a 'Kantian angst,' i.e., into worries that one may be entirely wrong about what words refer to.

In the second part, this Kantian angst is used as a modus tollens against the crucial principle of external realism, namely the Cartesianism principle. The principles of independence and correspondence are taken to be innocuous. In my view, this may be a bit too quick for the principle of correspondence, or rather, for the model-theoretic construal of the principle of correspondence. Throughout Button's work, the logical framework remains uncontroversial, but one might argue that in contemporary metaphysics of physics the pairs name/object and predicate/property do not sit well with structuralist interpretations of physical theories, or that worldly vagueness may yield an ambiguous correspondence between words and vague objects or properties, or that cognitive science may yield a better analysis of metaphysical categories. However this may be, from a Putnamian perspective it is correct to concentrate on the Cartesianism principle. Three different strategies Putnam has adopted at various stages in his life are critically discussed. The first strategy is nonrealism, and was developed in his first paper on the model-theoretic arguments 'Realism and Reason' (1977). Putnam tried to avoid the problematic reference relation, and proposed a verificationist theory of understanding instead. On this view, understanding is understood as an essentially private first-person psychological phenomenon. Button concludes that this position is unstable. The nonrealist is still looking for an external perspective but can only find herself alone. Nonrealism becomes 'external subjective idealism' (p. 80).

The next strategy is Putnam's natural realism from the mid-1990s. Putnam remarked that perception has been absent in philosophy since Austin, and that precisely Austin's direct realism might provide the solution for the model-theoretic arguments. He argued that in perception we have direct access to objects in the real world so that the gap between experience and the world is bridged. Button convincingly argues that the strategy cannot work. First, he notes, in that case we have only replaced the usual sceptical 'veil of sensations' by a 'veil of observables.' Since we do not have direct access to unobservable or abstract entities, the model-theoretic arguments can be applied to these classes of entities. It is strange that neither Button nor Putnam discusses van Fraassen's constructive empiricism at this point. If one is only a realist with regard to observable entities, the counterargument is barred. Nevertheless, Button has a stronger rejoinder (p. 93). Since natural realists are typically disjunctivists in order to explain hallucinatory experiences, it suffices to use Crispin Wright's argument that disjunctivism is enough to generate Cartesian angst, which, as has been demonstrated in the first part, inevitably leads to Kantian angst.

The third strategy is justificationism, i.e,. connecting truth with (idealized) justification. In a mildly technical chapter, the core of Button's argument is that empirically unjustifiable truth might exist. While this is plausibly the case, the central examples are not fully convincing. The first example is a truth-and-beauty bombs scenario, with two boxes in which, depending on whether some radioactive decay has occurred, a picture is drawn or not, while we can only open one box by exploding the other. However, this is rather opening a Pandora's box, because the scenario is analogous to Schrödinger's cat scenario, so that we will get entangled in complicating philosophical issues in quantum mechanics. The second scenario, one of Putnam's own, is based on the fact that we have no empirical access to what is outside our light cone and thus may not be able to know whether there is extraterrestrial life. However, since quirky solutions of Einstein's equation, even ones allowing for time travel, are possible, it may be hard to tell which points are definitely outside our light cone. The relation between idealized justification and truth is indeed complicated. But, as Button argues, if the possibility of unjustifiable empirical truth cannot be ruled out a priori, there remains room for Cartesian angst. All attempts to prevent Cartesian angst from rising have failed.

In the third part, Button turns from external realism towards (Putnam's) internal realism. Like external realism, it accepts the independence and correspondence principles, but rejects the Cartesianism principle and with it all forms of Cartesian angst. The central argument is Putnam's brain-in-a-vat argument. Button (p. 118) discusses the following version of the argument:

(1) A BIV's word 'brain' does not refer to brains.
(2) My word 'brain' refers to brains.
(3) So: I am not a BIV.

Central in the argument is a (mild form of) semantic externalism. The BIV's words do not refer to objects in the real world, because there is no appropriate relation between the words and objects in the world. Button argues that the only way that the BIV's brain can refer to brains in the possible world in which the brain exists is by means of a 'magical' reference relation. Premise (2) is justified by disquotation in the home language. If we do not accept that our words actually refer, we cannot even express the BIV-argument without recourse to a magical reference relation. Button argues that this response to Cartesian angst is very resilient and does not specifically depend on the BIV-scenario; it is valid in all scenarios in which we stand in a completely delusional relation to the world.

Subsequently, Button presents some variations on the original BIV-scenario, with the result that the distinction between internal and external realism becomes blurred. He presents scenarios that gradually shift from internal to external realism, without there being a clear transition point. Clear cases of such gradual shifts are the space-δ scenario, in which a universe with radius δ metres is considered, the past-δ space, which considers a universe that started δ seconds ago, and a future-δ universe that considers a universe that ends within δ seconds. Rather obviously, the space-1 scenario, i.e., a universe with a radius of one metre, is hardly compatible with semantic externalism. In the space-g scenario however, in which the universe has a radius g that encompasses the Milky Way, external reference is unproblematic except for reference to astronomical objects beyond our own galaxy. In this case, we would consider our astronomical theories to be empirically false, but this would not lead to Cartesian (and Kantian) angst. Other cases are more direct variations on the BIV-scenario, considering scenarios in which brains-in-a-vat exist on a distant neighbour Vat Earth and humans discover the brains-in-vats on a space mission, or cases where brains-in-a-vat get connected to human bodies, or human brains become envatted, and 'unfathomable' combinations of these (p. 160). Button argues that it is difficult to choose between internal and external realism, because our philosophical intuitions are not strong enough to determine a clear transition point in the gradual range from internal to external realism. The dichotomy between internal and external questions collapses and we end in a state of (mitigated) aporia. A similar analysis follows for issues relating to semantic externalism. Button presents us with some cases in which it is not clear whether meanings are in the head or are natural kinds in the external world. Semantic externalism, though mandated by our referential practices, becomes messy in exactly the same way as the internal/external dichotomy.

Button's argument for the demise of the internal/external distinction is innovative and compelling. However, precisely in view of the vat variations, one might wish that the original BIV-scenario would be more clearly spelled out. Button remarks that Brian, the brain-in-a-vat, "has a thoroughly messed-up relationship with the world. . . . [and we] should not, then, be surprised that his semantic relationship with the world is equally messed-up" (p. 120). However, the BIV-scenario is only relevant on the assumption that Brian's phenomenal experience is very similar to the phenomenal experience of a normal human being. If phenomenal experience is strongly correlated with neural activity, which seems a tacit premise in the BIV-scenario, and if, in view of the physical make-up of the brain, Brian's neural activation is causally determined by the electrical activation of the peripheral neural fibres by an external computer, this activation will determine Brian's phenomenal experience.

If Brian's phenomenal experience is identical to John's experience in possible world w (or in the actual world @), the computer connected to Brian will have to reproduce John's neural activation patterns. As a result, we might say that Brian's experience is strongly correlated with (or, on some accounts of causality, is caused by) events in world w, and that he has a rather straightforward semantic relationship with world w (or with the actual world @). At this point, I am inclined to believe that Brian's word 'brains' may refer to brains after all in world w and semantically similar worlds. Button's relativization of semantic externalism would seem to jeopardize internal realism after all and leave us in a less-than-mitigated state of aporia.

In the last chapters Button relates his reconstruction of Putnam's argumentation to current debates in metametaphysics. Button rejects Putnam's conceptual relativism, i.e., the claim that different acceptable conceptual schemes can determine different ontologies, and instead proposes conceptual cosmopolitanism, i.e., the view that one can be at home in different conceptual schemes, but whereby comparison between the schemes is possible. This view is brought to bear on the distinction between shallow and deep metaphysical questions. For reasons similar to those that make it impossible to draw a clear distinction between internal and external questions, one can no longer draw a clear distinction between shallow and deep metaphysical questions. Button shows the limitations of metametaphysical debates and resigns in a form of metametaphysical agnosticism. Here lies the real value of the book for present-day discussions. The clear, insightful, but rather innocent, analysis of Putnam's views on internal and external realism is suddenly turned into a subtle and subversive critique of fashionable metametaphysical positions.