The Limits of Reason in Hobbes's Commonwealth

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Michael P. Krom, The Limits of Reason in Hobbes's Commonwealth, Continuum, 2011, 240pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441182616.

Reviewed by George MacDonald Ross, University of Leeds


Krom rightly says that Hobbes claimed to show how the commonwealth or state is a human construct based on the rational self-interest of each individual constituting it -- in particular on the overarching motive to preserve his or her own life. The purpose of the present book is to demonstrate the inadequacy of any such approach, on the grounds that it leaves out, and even undermines, crucial factors such as "the role of the virtuous citizen, the philosopher, or the holy soul (as well as the institutions that sustain and cultivate such noble souls) in maintaining political stability" (p.1).

Later in the book, it becomes clear that what Krom means by this is that there are some individuals whose pride makes them value certain things more highly than their own lives, and hence are irrational in Hobbes's terms. In most cases, their pride is a danger to the state, and it must be suppressed. But in other cases, the state would not be viable without such people; and this reveals a contradiction in Hobbes's system, since he holds both that the preservation of the state requires that all citizens are motivated primarily by the fear of death, and that there must be a critical mass of individuals who are not so motivated -- hence 'the limits of reason' in the book's title.

Of course, just about everything we do carries some risk of death -- even something as mundane as crossing the road. What Krom has to do in order to prove that there is a contradiction at the heart of Hobbes's political philosophy is to demonstrate that the commonwealth cannot function unless there are some individuals who are willing to put their lives to at least as much risk as would be the case in a state of nature. In other words, their behaviour within the commonwealth contradicts their sole motive for assenting to and maintaining the social contract.

But first Krom expounds Hobbes's system, in the same order  Hobbes himself adopts in Leviathan. In the first four chapters, he starts out with Hobbes's account of how the individual human mind progresses from sensation, to imagination, to thinking, and to reason. He then moves to the creation of the state through the social contract, and discusses the relation between reason and the passions, and the ways in which the state is in danger of dissolution -- particularly the destabilising effect of prideful individuals. Krom's summary is generally very clear and judicious, and I particularly like the way that he stresses the importance of Hobbes's analogy between the state and the human body.

I do, however, have one serious difficulty with his exposition in the first chapter. Hobbes himself distinguishes sharply between 'bodies' in the external world; 'fancies' or 'phantasms', which are images in the mind caused by the motion of bodies and are themselves internal motions; and 'names', which are arbitrary sounds or marks used to refer to phantasms. But Krom causes unnecessary confusion by renaming Hobbes's 'phantasms' as 'physical objects', and 'names' as 'verbal objects'. It is confusing because, although phantasms are indeed motions in the material brain, they are not physical objects in any ordinary sense of the expression. Bodies are physical objects, and phantasms are not. Krom's use of the expression 'physical object' simply does not makes sense if it means a phantasm or image rather than a body, and sometimes he reverts to the ordinary meaning of 'physical object'. For example, on page 17, he talks of a tree being a physical object that bears fruit. But if a physical object is an image, it cannot bear fruit -- only a tree as a body can. The only way I can make any sense of this is if Krom is anachronistically interpreting Hobbes as a Kantian. Kant contrasted things in themselves with appearances (and on page 7, Krom equates bodies with 'things themselves'), but held that, thanks to the application of the categories, we can treat appearances as physical objects (his empirical realism). If this is Krom's reading of Hobbes, then he needs to give strong arguments for it.

In chapter five, Krom moves to criticism of Hobbes. Here his point is that, although Hobbes claims to build the commonwealth on the rational self-interest of every individual, it will not be viable without citizens who put moral values above the desire for self-preservation. Krom calls this a species of pride (taking pride in one's moral virtue), which in Hobbes's terms is irrational if it involves risking death. Krom focuses on the example of risking your life for your sovereign or country as a soldier, and claims that the state would collapse in the face of external or internal threats unless people were willing to risk their lives fighting for it. This contradicts Hobbes's central tenet that the ultimate motive of the rational man is to avoid death. But, while Hobbes certainly accepts that some people are indeed altruistic, Krom fails to establish that it is impossible (or that Hobbes believed that it is impossible) for a sovereign to maintain a loyal army without altruism. Obviously it is in a sovereign's interest to act in such a way as to build up a cadre of followers who will voluntarily give up their lives for him. But history is full of examples of dictators who have succeeded militarily with a conscript army motivated by a fear of punishment greater than their fear of death in battle. This is precisely Hobbes's minimalist conception of what is necessary for the preservation of the state, and anything consensual is a desirable but non-essential extra.

Nevertheless, Krom is surely correct that the body politic would barely function if its citizens were motivated solely by the desire to avoid death. But it is not clear that this is Hobbes's position. The fear of death comes in because it is the ultimate reason why individuals get together to form a state: they are more likely to be protected from death, and other evils such as theft, if they submit to the authority of a sovereign. It is also the overriding motive for continuing to obey the sovereign, since mass disobedience would mean civil war and reversion to the state of nature. But far more is needed to ensure the proper functioning of the state, and it is the job of the sovereign to legislate appropriately. Krom seems to assume that, for Hobbes, people will obey laws only when they fear punishment for breaking them. Thus on page 90, he writes: "Hobbes's just man does not stand up to the 'ring of Gyges' thought experiment': given the power of invisibility, Hobbes's just man will procure his own advantage without regard for law or the contracts he has made." But I don't see this in what Hobbes writes. Rather, having committed to the social contract, the just man will honour the contract by obeying the laws ordained by the sovereign, and will do so autonomously, and not just out of fear of punishment. Fear of death is the motive for entering and maintaining the contract in general, but not for abiding by the details. Civil society makes possible the mutual trust that is absent from the state of nature.

In chapter 6, Krom moves to the role of philosophy in maintaining political stability. He distinguishes vain from true philosophy, and summarises Hobbes's explanation of the origin of vain philosophy and how it leads to sedition through the pride of philosophers in thinking that they know better than the sovereign. In explaining the origin of vain philosophy, Krom focuses on the failure of philosophers to define their terms (Leviathan 8), and omits to mention the passage in Leviathan 46 (especially the Latin version), where Hobbes ingeniously diagnoses the ultimate source of vain philosophy as being the verb 'to be' when used as the copula and Greek and Latin. Aristotle assumed that there must be something in reality corresponding to every component of a true proposition. Since there is no material substance or quality corresponding to 'is', he invented the immaterial entity 'being', and hence the whole range of fictitious metaphysical entities integral to vain philosophy. Since it lacks the copula, the Hebrew language is not infected by meaningless abstractions or immaterialism, and the Old Testament contains a purer theology than that of Greek and Latin writers influenced by Aristotle.

As for the positive role of philosophy, it has two branches: natural and civil. Natural philosophy (what we would now call 'science') should be directed towards improving the quality of life, and this excludes metaphysics, which at best can do no more than satisfy the curiosity and pride of metaphysicians. Civil philosophy, on the other hand, is the new science invented by Hobbes, the function of which is to support the sovereign in maintaining the integrity of the state, and improving the life of its citizens. Hobbes went as far as to claim that the doctrines of Leviathan should be taught in the universities. Now, this is all very true of what Hobbes says, but Krom fails to explain how it is inconsistent with Hobbes's account of what it is for humans to be rational. It certainly goes beyond an exclusive concern with preserving one's life, but there is no inconsistency in wanting to improve the quality of life that one has preserved. An inconsistency would arise only if it were necessary for philosophers to risk their lives for their discipline -- but Krom fails to show this, apart from mentioning Bacon's accidentally catching his death of a cold while experimenting with freezing chickens (p.130).

In chapter 7, Krom considers religion. He gives an extensive account of Hobbes's reasons for saying that the sovereign must be the head of the church as well as head of state. The commonwealth cannot stand if there is divided authority, and in a world in which religion is a major issue, it is intolerable for there to be more than one arbiter of religious correctness. Because religious beliefs are held so deeply, the inevitable result of divided authority is civil war, and a reversion to the state of nature.

No individual can have valid grounds for claiming divine inspiration, and the only way of reconciling Christianity with the preservation of the commonwealth is for the sovereign to be the sole authority on how the Bible is to be interpreted. Hobbes's rational man is as concerned about his prospects for immortality as he is about his survival in this life. But all that is required for salvation is to believe that Jesus is the Christ, and to obey the sovereign's interpretation of what follows from this. It would therefore be irrational for him to believe he had a better chance of immortality by preferring his private interpretation of the Bible to that of the divinely appointed sovereign.

The greatest threat to the commonwealth comes from the Roman Catholic Church, which claims a greater authority over people's beliefs and behaviour than that of the secular sovereign. Indeed, it claims universal authority, and not merely over a single jurisdiction, as is the case with the Anglican church. Consequently, it is essential for the preservation of the commonwealth that Roman Catholicism be outlawed, and that all traces of Catholic and pagan philosophy be eliminated from the teachings of divinity schools in the universities.

To turn to the positive side, it is perfectly consistent with Hobbes's account of rational self-interest, that, once the commonwealth has been formed and the sovereign established, teachers and preachers should be required to promulgate the official religion as determined by the sovereign as head of the Anglican church. But Krom started out with the project of showing that divines must be willing to risk their lives in propagating the state religion, otherwise there is no inconsistency with their rational self-interest. However, the nearest he comes to an argument for this is when he discusses Hobbes's concept of charity (pp.168-9). Hobbes does indeed advocate the virtue of mutual charity: Thou shalt love thy neighbour as thyself. Krom assumes that this implies that everyone (and not merely divines) should be willing to die for the sake of the commonwealth, in contradiction to their motive for setting it up in the first place. But he doesn't give any argument for this, let alone justify the claim he made on page 1 that there must be some holy (but irrational) souls in order to maintain political stability.

In short, Krom's book contains much that is true about Hobbes's political philosophy and theology, but he fails in his narrower purpose of showing that the commonwealth must include people who are willing to set aside their fear of death, and sacrifice their lives.