The Limits of the Self: Immunology and Biological Identity

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Thomas Pradeu, The Limits of the Self: Immunology and Biological Identity, Elizabeth Vitanza (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2012, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199775286.

Reviewed by Alfred I. Tauber, Boston University


Serious philosophical attention to immunological theory over the past two decades has shown how this science contributed to, and also drew from, notions of personal identity and cognition (Tauber and Chernyak 1991; Löwy 1991; Moulin 1991; Tauber 1994; 2004; 2008; Howes 1998). While immunologists routinely employ the 'self/non-self' distinction to model their findings, immune identity has proven an intractable problem in the face of perplexing conceptual obstacles and frustrating paradoxes. This readership needs no introduction to the problematic status of personal identity in the philosophical literature, in which mental states, consciousness, and a host of related areas have left 'the self,' in the words of Wittgenstein, "mysterious." That the science assigned the task of establishing the epistemological basis of biological identity has failed to fulfill its theoretical mandate should be of interest to philosophers. Alas, the literature has remained scant. Fortunately, Thomas Pradeu has joined the small cadre of those studying the philosophical significance of immunology and assumed the task of rectifying this neglect. In a text that provides an up-to-date summary of the key features of immunological theory and places those findings into a philosophical context that has framed previous debates, he has made a noteworthy contribution to immunology's abundant theoretical literature, which enjoys a richness almost unique among the physiological sciences (e.g., Burnet and Fenner 1949; Jerne 1974; Cohn 1986; Varela et al, 1988; Cohen 1992).

The Limits of the Self is, in part, an immunology primer, albeit a rather sophisticated one. Despite excellent illustrations, I suspect the uninitiated will encounter significant difficulties in comprehending the science, but is it fair to ask a philosopher of physics to explain the basic laws of mechanics or quantum theory so that the philosophical issues of causality might be explored? The analogy seems hardly far-fetched, and so I endorse the approach taken here, recognizing that to appreciate this work requires preliminary understanding of the basic structure of the immune system and its regulation. Once mastered, the central conceptual issue clearly appears: How might (organismic) identity be defined immunologically?

A New Biology

Following earlier philosophical and historical studies, The Limits of the Self examines how immunology has been defined as the science of self/non-self discrimination. That definition developed within the medical context of determining how an organism maintains its integrity in the face of pathogenic invasion (the original problematic that emerged with the discovery of infectious diseases at the end of the nineteenth century). However, over the past half century, the discrimination of self and other has been obscured by the appreciation that the immune system routinely (and normally) also reacts against host elements as it searches for aberrant cells (whether malignant, damaged, or senescent) and degrades them. Such 'autoimmunity' may become pathogenic and cause serious disease, so a spectrum of self-directed immune responses have highlighted that the self/non-self division has a blurred border.

This modification of the self/other dichotomy has also been complemented by an 'ecological' sensibility, where the interchange of inter-species commerce demands integration of the foreign (Tauber 2008). On this view, the immune system is not solely concerned with protecting the insularity of organisms living in a dangerous world, but includes mechanisms that allow for the influx of nutrients and other elements necessary for survival. These must be 'tolerated,' not destroyed. On this view, the organism is no longer regarded as a circumscribed entity, but rather an integrated member of a commerce characterized by dialectical exchange (Levins and Lewontin 1985). Reconceiving the insular self as an active participant in an ecological economy shifts the defensive orientation of immunity (i.e., a self posed against an invasive other) to a more complex contextual identification. While the notion of individuality offers an important means to conceptualize the units of complex systems, such formulations also impose a constructive order that determines how that larger system is understood. Simply, a subject-object modality of organization inherently restricts a fuller understanding of the organism in its dialectical inter-changes with the world.

A third perspective contesting immunology's central tenet of selfhood originates in the discovery of widespread symbiosis throughout the animal kingdom , which supplants the notion of singular individuality of organisms with a conception of interactive relationships within the organism (Gilbert and Epel 2009; Douglas 2010). Indeed, symbiosis has become a core principle of contemporary biology, having replaced an essentialist conception of "individuality" with one fitting within the larger systems approach now pushing the life sciences in diverse directions (Tauber 2012; Gilbert, Sapp, and Tauber, in press). Immunology joins this re-conception with the growing appreciation of how symbionts help develop and organize immune functions (ibid.), which adds further ambiguity to the notion of organismic identity (ibid.).

So, from the vantages of normal autoimmunity, ecological exchange, and symbiotic relationships, the boundaries that would define immune identity have proven to be open. Accordingly, the guiding assumption that a self exists as an entity, and that its protection would be defined by some definable criteria, has fallen into disrepute. Thus, instead of maintaining (protecting) the integrity of an integral, defined individual, establishing that identity has become a more fundamental (and encompassing) way of thinking about immunity. And, of course, that matter has a long philosophical history that informs this discussion.

In the early modern period, mirroring the appearance of the independent citizen, the notion of the autonomous individual agent framed a biology that was organized around the study of living entities. Anatomical, physiological, and developmental criteria were conceived solely in terms of individuals, and even Darwin regarded aggregates of individuals, the species, as identifiable units in competition with one another. With the understanding that living cells comprised complex organisms, a new orientation slowly developed concerning the integration of physiological processes and anatomic units, but still within the confines of a singular organism that would maintain its autonomy. Only with the emergence of ecology in the second half of the nineteenth century, did organic systems -- comprised of individuals in cooperative and competitive relationships -- complement the individual-based conceptions of the life sciences. On this general view, a self appears as a product of an artificial third-person point of view and requires the imposition of criteria to establish boundaries and identity by which to demarcate individuals from the context in which they live.

Reconceiving selfhood in a contextualized schema breaks the formal alterity of 'the other' by replacing a rigid subject-object dichotomy denied by the complexity of biological organization and regulation. Indeed, immunologists have long-appreciated that the original theories outlining self/non-self discrimination severely limit the comprehension of multifaceted immune functions. Pradeu devotes almost half of his text to explaining current thinking on these matters. The discussion is based on Sir Macfarlane Burnet's original self/non-self model, which proposed the first theoretical basis for a discriminatory immune mechanism (Burnet and Fenner 1949). He extended the finding that animals exposed to foreign substances in utero do not respond to them after birth. According to his theory, the immune system 'learns' what is self during embryogenesis and develops 'holes' in its repertoire so that later in life, such substances do not provoke an immune response. In other words, host elements are ignored because of their presentation at the time the immune system develops. While the basic experimental findings have not been refuted, the theory based on these findings has proven inadequate to account for autoimmunity as a normal phenomenon. Pradeu builds his narrative on this story.


Pradeu joins me in addressing the misapplication of essentialism to the notion of organismal identity (Tauber 2000; 2004; 2008; 2012). He dismisses the utility of basing immunology's theory on self/non-self dichotomy and its on/off system of regulation; instead, he forcefully argues that a continuum of activities better captures the diverse functions of the immune system, where regulation requires a balance between immune tolerance (non-reactivity) against those functions that destroy 'the other.' The spectrum of immune responses ranges from silence (when substances are actively ignored or left unrecognized) to varying degrees of stimulation. While normal degradation activities (e.g., immune processing of senescent red cells after a 120-day lifespan) dominate immune activities, almost all of current research examines the fully stimulated case, which continues the tradition of regarding the immune system as a defending army protecting the host. However, this medical (and thus social) requirement distorts the character of immunity, which, for the most part, serves the multi-functional physiological roles of surveillance, degradation, and repair. Indeed, from a phylogenetic perspective, at least in vertebrates, defense became a specialized function (Tauber 2003; 2004).

So, replacing a rigid self/non-self opposition proposed by Burnet, Pradeu offers a putative new concept, continuity, upon which to build a revised theory of immunity. He has ingenuously combined previous orientations and a deft encapsulating schema that defines 'continuity' as an account of the immune response arising from a "strong modification of the antigenic patterns (ligands) with which the organism's immune receptors interact" (p. 131). On this view, immunity should be depicted in a multi-dimensional framework in which both temporal and 'spatial' patterns of antigens (substances that stimulate immune reactions) determine immunogenicity. The model then predicts that degrees of activation result from varying degrees of disturbance, which in turn is determined by the degree to which the antigen patterns differ from normal.

While Pradeu claims originality, he closely follows two earlier theories: In the 1970s, Niels Jerne conceived the immune system as a lattice of interlocking components, which, when disturbed, initiate immune responses (Jerne 1974). Pradeu's 'pattern' and Jerne's 'lattice' mirror each other, inasmuch as each depiction draws upon the basic idea of disrupting some self-regulated, ordered, interlocking system. Although the components and organization of each model differ in important respects, both share a similar conceptual view of the immune system's regulation. Of particular theoretical interest, Jerne dispensed with the self/non-self criteria of immunogenicity that characterized Burnetian immunology (Cohn 1986; Tauber 2000). Indeed, the network only 'knows' itself and thus only a disruption of its own connections would signal a response (Valrela et al 1988). The second model, one more recently proposed by Polly Matzinger (1994), also endows Pradeu's notion of continuity. In her representation, a basic resting state is disturbed by 'danger,' which generates signals derived from injured, infected, or aberrant cells. Much in line with Jerne's notion of an integrated system, anything that breaks or disorders the connectivity of the elements initiates an immune response. While 'danger' remains ill-defined, the concept of some resting state of conjoined elements closely resonates with the continuity idea Pradeu promotes. Her formulation more closely follows current thinking about the composition and regulation of the immune system than Jerne's proposal does, but as much as Pradeu criticizes her model (well placed, I should add), the basic conceptual basis of continuity and danger remained locked together.


Ultimately the fecundity of a scientific idea must be tried in the laboratory and it is premature to adjudicate Pradeu's contribution. However, it is not too early to discuss the philosophical issues at stake, i.e., the distinction between identity and individuality, and how continuity elucidates these issues. Pradeu forcefully argues that while identity cannot be satisfactorily addressed by immunology (Burnet's notion of selfhood having been discarded), individuality does gain traction as the science determines the basis of defending the integrity of the organism through immune mechanisms initiated by antigen pattern disruption. And conversely, at 'physiological' levels of autoimmunity, the immune system integrates itself into the body's economy and thus serves as a crucial component of individuation (pp. 244-5). The discernment of such immune activity, however, leaves a tautological definition of the individual, which Pradeu recognizes at the beginning of his treatise: When 'the 'self' and the 'non-self' "are reduced to synonyms for 'non-immunogenic' and 'immunogenic' . . . .the self-nonself theory ceases to provide an explanation for immunity" (p. 46). By the end of the book, he falls back into the imbroglio he had identified 200 pages earlier.

The problem centers on tolerance. In his criticism of the danger theory (pp. 214-18), Pradeu remarks that Matzinger provides no criteria for establishing tolerance, a telling comment that equally applies to his own model. This is a critical issue for that which is tolerated constitutes identification in a positive sense, and thus establishes the baseline of immune reactivity, i.e., the set point (or origin) of 'what is mine,' i.e., tolerated. And that set point must be understood within an evolutionary context: Considering that immunity arose in coordination with the evolution of various physiological processes (including aging), immunity became an integrated component of normal physiology , for instance, as shown by the shared regulation of the endocrine, nervous and immune systems (Ader 2007). On this view, the criteria for 'baseline' immunogenicity would emerge as part of the body's metabolism. However, we have little understanding of how the immune system is structured and pre-programmed to function in harmony with other systems and thereby possess the early patterns of tolerance required at birth. Such a research program would provide Pradeu's thesis with traction, and while preliminary findings are demonstrating this basic architecture (Madi et al 2009; Bransburg-Zabary et al, 2012), a concerted effort must be devoted to this fundamental problem. Because we have little understanding of how the immune system integrates with other physiologies, post-self theorists have only been able to present the end of the immunogenicity story without providing a beginning. If tolerance and immunogenicity have no grounding, what confers degrees of activation when the self/non-self construction is discarded? What is the "functional-structure" that guides immune reactivity? Rejecting the self/non-self model, how might we account for the immune system's self-organization? Pradeu calls me to task (p. 134) for previously posing this problem (as applied to my critique of Jerne's network theory) (Tauber 1999), yet continuity provides no schema to account for the basis for tolerance, which must be the starting point for the continuum of immune responses.

Summary and Conclusion

The biology of individuality requires a conception that allows for the ceaseless exchange of organism and environment, autoimmunity, and the symbiont composite structure of the organism. From these perspectives, the host has been deconstructed, thereby making identity the crucial philosophical issue at the foundation of immunology. And Pradeu readily admits (chapter 6) that immunology has not solved the identity question, but holds that individuality (identity's derivative) does find a biological answer in this discipline. He can make this claim only by accepting the phenomenon of tolerance as a given (and left unexplained). However, the identity function which establishes that which is tolerated (in Burnet's terms, the self) has not been accounted for, so the baseline from which immune reactivity can be predicted has not been proffered. In sum, without the basis of capturing the identity function, individuality is left in limbo as well. Here, the science becomes philosophically very interesting.

Immunology's philosophical imbroglio may be set at the door of the stove by which Descartes had his famous dream, where he conceived the self as an indubitable cogito, a thinking thing; in the immune context, this ontological understanding translated 'the immune self' as another thing, an entity with an identity. This conception commanded wide influence in the formation of immunology's founding models and oriented Burnet's self/non-self theory (Tauber 1994). The weakness of the Burnetian paradigm rests on its adherence to a notion of identity conceived in terms of defending a host (a finite entity), where immunity is defined in the division of self and other. However, the immune system establishes that very identity in question over time by defining that which must be identified, i.e., the what to be defended over the lifespan of the organism (Tauber 2003). However, to equate immune identity with entity misconstrues what immunity does. The alternative position, the one whose outline is beginning to emerge, regards immunity as an on-going developmental process, i.e., one with no strict criteria of identification, but derived in an as yet poorly understood intercourse with the entire body. And as discussed, such a conception requires integration with evolutionary mechanisms (Buss 1987).

Although determining the evolutionary forces guiding the development of immunity was identified in early immune theorizing, those who assumed the given identity of the organism (a self modeled much along Cartesian lines) generally dominated those who argued for organismic identity arising within a larger, life-long developmental process (Tauber and Chernyak 1991; Tauber 2003; 2004). Perhaps the cardinal contribution of The Limits of the Self is to again highlight the limits of the current prevailing thought collective and the importance of this alternative research program, for in asserting that immunologists have abandoned identity as the key research issue, their discipline is left ungrounded and, consequently, conceptually adrift. And philosophers, especially those with a naturalistic bent, should take heed of this state of affairs and consider how the limits described here impact their own considerations.


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