The Literary Kierkegaard

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Eric Ziolkowski, The Literary Kierkegaard, Northwestern University Press, 2011, 423pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780810127821.

Reviewed by George Pattison, Christ Church, Oxford


Eric Ziolkowski's The Literary Kierkegaard doesn't quite do what it says on the label. The back-cover blurb by Ed Mooney, himself a philosopher whose work has always been attuned to the literary nuances of Kierkegaard's writings, states that 'Nothing like this book now exists. It will become the indispensable source for anyone wishing to see past the philosophical Kierkegaard to encounter the neglected literary Kierkegaard'. The inside cover also speaks of 'a significant lack in our understanding of one of the most significant thinkers of the modern era'. I suppose that publishers have to say these things to sell books, but they do so at the risk of setting up a false set of expectations that may not be appropriate anyway. For whilst it may be true that a certain tranche of philosophers have resolutely plundered Kierkegaard's works for arguments and assertions that can be used in university philosophy courses without regard to style or context, there have been relatively few entirely devoid of sense for the literary 'how' of Kierkegaard's distinctive body of writings -- even if there is then disagreement as to how this impacts on the philosopher's work with the text. Indeed, Ziolkowski's introduction elegantly weaves together a narrative combining Kierkegaard's own absorption of aesthetic theory and literary practice with the role these have played in his subsequent reception. The first non-Kierkegaardian citation in the book appropriately enough refers to the Devil's description of Kierkegaard as 'the Christian in love with aesthetics' in Thomas Mann's novel Doctor Faustus (p. 5) -- an allusion that already indicates how Kierkegaard had become a recognizable point of reference in German literature by the mid-twentieth century.

As far as Kierkegaard himself goes, The Literary Kierkegaard opens with a strikingly ambivalent note from the early journals in which the Dane writes, 'If I am a literary weed -- well, then at least I am what is called "Proud Henry."' (p. 3) This already flags difficulties of classification, and Ziolkowski considers both Kierkegaard's own later claim to have been 'a kind of poet' (an expression used by Louis Mackey as the title of an influential study from 1971), as well as the case for seeing him more as a singular kind of prose stylist or novelist, a discussion that also involves some insightful remarks on Kierkegaard's distinctive and ubiquitous use of more or less freely re-written quotations. This brings us back once more to 'Proud Henry', with regard to which Ziolkowski cites one of Kierkegaard's pseudonyms from Stages on Life's Way:

Suppose there was a book that was printed once and could not be reprinted and in it there was no place to make corrections, but in the list of printing errors there was a reading that was much more expressive than what stood in the same place in the text -- then it would have to be satisfied with remaining standing among the printing errors but nevertheless with its fullness of meaning. Suppose there was a weed that grew apart from the useful grain -- then it would indeed stand on the side, would indeed be a weed, and would indeed be a disgrace, but suppose that it was nevertheless called Proud Henry (p. 31).

As Ziolkowski comments, this passage effectively sums up many of the key issues involved in considering 'the literary Kierkegaard': it is by a pseudonym, the primary analogue is itself related to literature and book-production, it is resolutely hypothetical ('suppose . . . suppose . . . suppose . . . '), and it leads us to what a later philosopher would call the margins of philosophy and, we might add, of writing in general. Yet, Ziolkowski adds, the weed analogy is significant also in that it anticipates the 'irritant' role that Kierkegaard would play in Danish life, letters, and religion as well as his weed-like dissemination across the field of European literature.

It should already be clear that Ziolkowski approaches his material with an appropriate sense for its multi-levelled and often ambiguous character, and the structure of his book is designed to do justice to the manifold nature of its subject-matter -- what he calls 'the limitless complexity of the literary Kierkegaard' (p. 257). Rather than attempt to give an exhaustive account of Kierkegaard's literary and aesthetic sources, theories, and practices, or to produce a definitive survey of the relevant secondary literature, he identifies five different kinds of relationship between Kierkegaard and literature that he explores through five comparative studies, with Aristophanes, Wolfram von Eschenbach's Parzival, Don Quixote, Shakespeare, and Thomas Carlyle. As he makes clear from the outset, these all have a very different status vis-à-vis Kierkegaard's own writing.

Aristophanes plays an important role in the Kierkegaard's Magister's dissertation On The Concept of Irony (where he is said to have given the truest historical picture of Socrates) and Shakespeare is similarly the subject of explicit discussion, especially in the treatment of Romeo and Juliet and Hamlet in Stages on Life's Way. Don Quixote presents a more elusive case and although Kierkegaard probably inspired writers such as Unamuno and Auden to refer to the Spanish knight as a 'knight of faith', Kierkegaard himself never did so (pp. 129-30). In fact, the Knight of La Mancha appears as a model both for the delusional kind of believer obsessed by an idée fixe and for the true Christian -- and he also appears as a prototype of the speculative thinker lost in a fantastic 'chimera of abstraction' (pp. 156-63).

Parzival is different again, since there is no evidence of Kierkegaard having read the eponymous poem despite his extensive absorption in medieval literature and culture during his student years (in fact, his extracts from a study of the troubadours by a contemporary Danish scholar constitute the largest single unit of his student reading notes). In this case (which Ziolkowski describes as 'a regrettable Bildungslücke or gap in Kierkegaard's otherwise extraordinary literary cultivation' [p. 125]), it becomes more a matter of using a Kierkegaardian perspective to interpret the poem. Despite Kierkegaard's own somewhat Hegelian reservations concerning the unresolved dualisms of medieval culture, the holy fool Parzival thus emerges as a potential prototype of the existential and spiritual individual journeying from the aesthetic, through the ethical, and towards the religious.

Finally Carlyle, whose long life encompassed Kierkegaard's own short earthly sojourn, is an example of a writer contemporary with Kierkegaard who neither knew nor was known by the Dane. Nevertheless, they both drew on many of the same sources, especially the literature and philosophy of German Romanticism and idealism, and they are shown to have had interestingly comparable views with regard to humour and irony -- as well as each of them exhibiting a deep interplay between humour and melancholy. 'Accordingly,' writes Ziolkowski,

to overlook the pertinence of suffering to Kierkegaard's notion of the humourist, or the pathos inherent in Carlyle's concept of true humor; to miss the inchoate despair beneath the sarcastic laugh of Kierkegaard's ironist, or the bitterness with which Carlyle resigns himself to his own inveterate tendency toward irony -- to do any of these things would preclude a proper construal of either writer. (p. 255)

'Yet,' as Ziolkowski continues, 'the dialectic works the other way as well' (p. 255).

Finally, in an extended Conclusion, Ziolkowski sketches some of the receptions of Kierkegaard in Scandinavian and English-language literature and in Dreyer's film Ordet (The Word). Although there are many fruitful insights in these closing pages, I am not entirely clear as to the rationale for the selection of texts, and several of the more recent English-language fictions invoking Kierkegaard seems scarcely to merit comparison with Ibsen, Dreyer, or even Stangerup -- and, of course (and as I'm sure Ziolkowski is aware), there are several major modern authors who could have been drawn into the discussion, including Thomas Mann (with whom we began), Kafka, Rilke, and Walker Percy (although Kafka does get a brief mention earlier in the book).

From what has been said, it should be clear that it is difficult to give a uniform or overall assessment of Ziolkowski's achievement. If I started by criticizing the publisher's spin regarding the uniqueness of the work, I am happy to concede the claims on the inside cover that it is both 'monumental' and will prove 'a necessary resource' for a wide range of Kierkegaard readers. Anyone who reads this book carefully cannot but come away with an enhanced sense for just how much is going on in Kierkegaard's authorship and with a greater appreciation of Kierkegaard's presence in the world of Romantic and modern literature. Much of the book's strength lies in the fine detail, both discussions spread over several pages and in one-off remarks or allusions.

Ziolkowski has an acute sense for how the re-application of Kierkegaardian tropes such as the knight of faith can generate misreadings of Kierkegaard himself (as when we read back into Kierkegaard the view that Quixote was a knight of faith) but can also be useful heuristic tools for exploring other literary sources (as in the discussion of Parzival). Similarly, he is alert to how our view of Kierkegaard can be shaped by literary tropes that may or may not have a secure foothold in the primary sources -- a striking example of which is the tendency, following Harald Høffding, to see Kierkegaard as a modern Hamlet (p. 257). In these terms, whilst he does not exactly offer any major new claims regarding the big picture of Kierkegaard's reception of literary sources or even regarding the more particular authors and figures he adopts from literature, Ziolkowski takes the whole discussion up a level or -- in an image that repeatedly came to me in reading the text -- he thickens the soup, i.e., he demonstrates the depth, complexity, and multi-functional nature of Kierkegaard's relations to literature (which might also be taken as a useful warning against major claims about big pictures).

There is, however, one major exception to what I have just said, and that is the treatment of Aristophanes in Chapter 1. Here Ziolkowski really does break new ground. Of course, no reader of The Concept of Irony ought to miss the claim that of all the ancient portrayals of Socrates, that of Aristophanes came nearest to the truth -- indeed it is the seventh of the theses that the dissertation sets out to defend. Yet it is an extremely odd claim, given that Aristophanes' portrait of one whom Kierkegaard regarded as his only role model and of whom he reverentially spoke as the 'simple wise man of ancient times' was far from flattering. Ziolkowski's approach to the question is characteristic of all that is best in his book. Having introduced a number of views regarding the debate about Aristophanes' Socrates and the relationship between Aristophanes and Plato, he proceeds to demonstrate the place of Aristophanes in Romantic literature in Germany and Denmark. Kierkegaard's own student comedy 'The Battle between the Old and the New Soap-Cellars' is seen as a manifestation of this 'vogue' for Aristophanes. More generally, Kierkegaard, closely following then current scholarship, seems to have mostly viewed Aristophanes 'as a conservative reformer or "cleanser" of the state' (p. 77), whilst simultaneously (and despite affirming the justification of Aristophanes' portrayal of Socrates) exonerating Socrates from being culpable for the ills that Aristophanes was actually attacking. In fact, Kierkegaard seems not really to have grappled with the scandal that Aristophanes' play may have contributed to the condemnation of Socrates, and he mistakenly invokes a garbled story about Socrates himself having approved of it (p. 70).

But Ziolkowski also moves beyond The Concept of Irony to show the continuing role that Aristophanes played in Kierkegaard's subsequent authorship. Not even his own experience of vilification at the hands of the satirical magazine The Corsair shook Kierkegaard's adherence to the principle of justified laughter, since what The Corsair served up would not, in his view, have met with Aristophanes' own approval (p. 84). As his career progresses, we thus see Kierkegaard 'protect[ing] his own esteem for Aristophanes as reformer from conflicting with his own ever-growing reverence for Socrates as ironist' (p. 77). 'Remarkably,' as Ziolkowski comments, 'Kierkegaard was never led by his identification with the victimized Socrates to turn against the Athenian sage's most famous derider' (p. 85). Ziolkowski concludes that it would be stretching a point to call Kierkegaard, 'the so-called Christian Socrates', 'also a Christian Aristophanes' (p. 85). And if, in the end, it is Socrates who is the victor on account of his ethical passion, Kierkegaard's Socrates might be inconceivable without his accompanying Aristophanic alter ego. We might also say that, despite the tragic notes especially associated with Shakespeare, a sub-theme of The Literary Kierkegaard is that of the humorous and even the comic Kierkegaard, as we meet him directly in the chapters on Aristophanes, Carlyle, and perhaps more indirectly in the discussion of the holy fools Parzival and Don Quixote.

Having read this book and having reviewed it, I can only look forward to re-reading it and re-reading in it on many future occasions. There is a lot to learn. And, in keeping with the subject-matter, it is also an enjoyable book to read, displaying human as well as scholarly understanding.