The Living Constitution

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David A. Strauss, The Living Constitution, Oxford University Press, 2010, 150pp., $21.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195377279.

Reviewed by Craig Duncan, Ithaca College


The task of writing a very short book for a lay audience on the subject of U.S. constitutional interpretation might seem like a fool's errand. After all, if such a book is to say anything of substance, it will need to impart to its readers at least some basic understanding of legal philosophy, legal history, and legal terminology. Moreover, in order to keep its broad themes visible, it will have to impart this understanding without enveloping the reader in a fog of technical detail. Finally, it will need to be written with enough panache to keep the reader engaged despite the abstract nature of its subject.

Fortunately, David A. Strauss -- no fool, he -- achieves all these things with his book The Living Constitution, which offers a robust defense of an approach to constitutional interpretation that shuns any notion of original intent. Indeed, although the book is written primarily with the intelligent lay reader in mind -- there is not a single footnote or endnote to be found anywhere, for instance -- I believe that many specialists in law and philosophy can read and learn from it. That said, by keeping the book so short (it clocks in at just 139 small-sized pages), Strauss does not give himself space enough to consider adequately at least one interesting competing theory of interpretation. After highlighting the strengths of Strauss's text, this review will end with a brief sketch of this neglected alternative.

Strauss defines a living constitution as "one that evolves, changes over time, and adapts to new circumstances, without being formally amended" (p. 1). The competing theory is "originalism," which Strauss defines as "the view that constitutional provisions mean what the people who adopted them -- in the 1790s or 1860s or whenever -- understood them to mean" (ibid.). The book defends living constitutionalism as not only a genuine possibility, but in fact the only realistic possibility on offer; originalism, Strauss maintains, suffers from numerous defects that render it unworkable.

Chapter One of the book, entitled "Originalism and Its Sins," describes four such defects. The first is that originalism entails implausible results. In this vein, Strauss mercilessly describes a wide range of uncontroversial constitutional understandings that originalists would have to give up were they to apply their theory consistently. Significant among these are the principle that racial segregation is unconstitutional; the principle that gender discrimination is unconstitutional; the principle that the states are bound by the First Amendment; and the constitutionality of federal labor, consumer protection, and environmental laws. Strauss notes that even the most famous contemporary originalist, Justice Antonin Scalia, has acknowledged that originalism generates some extreme results that he is not willing to write into his opinions. Strauss quotes Scalia remarking in his own defense, "I'm an originalist -- I'm not a nut," prompting Strauss in turn to comment wryly, "if following a theory consistently would make you a nut, isn't that a problem with the theory?" (p. 17).

The three remaining defects of originalism, according to Strauss, are as follows. First, there is the "amateur historian problem": judges do not necessarily have the historical expertise required to uncover "original understandings" from long ago -- and what is more, there may not have been settled understandings back in the eighteenth century of many of the key phrases of the Constitution (e.g., "freedom of speech"). Second, there is the "problem of translation": even if judges could uncover the original understandings, it is often unclear how to translate those understandings so that they apply to today's very different society. Finally, there is "Jefferson's Problem." This takes its name from Thomas Jefferson, who once wrote that "The earth . . . belongs to the living," and from this concluded that one generation's words could not bind a subsequent generation. Following Jefferson, Strauss asks why we should be required to follow the constitutional understandings of people long dead.

From here Strauss turns to a defense of his non-originalist alternative of "living constitutionalism." His defense consists of a description of this alternative along with responses to key objections to it, chief among which are the worries, first, that living constitutionalism gives judges free rein to substitute their personal policy preferences in place of the law, and second, that living constitutionalism renders the actual text of the constitution irrelevant.

The living constitutionalism that Strauss recommends is an approach rooted in common law methods, with its emphasis on precedent and tradition. Far from being an unworkable theory, according to Strauss this has in fact long been the actual approach used to interpret the Constitution. One great service that Strauss performs for the lay reader lies in providing an overview of this approach in Chapter Two (titled simply "The Common Law"). This overview is the clearest brief exposition and defense of the common law's methods that I am aware of.

A common law approach to constitutional interpretation, with its emphasis on precedent, gives us a "living" constitution, Strauss claims, because precedents evolve over time, shaped by notions of fairness and good policy. While the reference to notions of fairness and good policy invites the worry that the common law approach opens the Constitution to manipulation by judges, Strauss argues that this is simply not the case, for the common law approach has in fact restrained judges for centuries. "The content of law is determined by the evolutionary process that produced it. Present-day interpreters may contribute to the evolution -- but only by continuing the evolution, not by ignoring what exists and starting anew" (p. 38). In the usual case, the precedents will be clear and dictate a single result. But sometimes there will be reasonable disagreement over which way the precedents point. In such cases, says Strauss, a judge's decision will be shaped by his or her views regarding which decision "will be more fair or is more in keeping with good social policy" (ibid). However, "even where the precedents are not decisive, and judgments about fairness or social policy come into play, they come into play only in the narrow range left open by the precedents" (p. 40).

According to Strauss, no algorithm specifies how judges should decide in cases where precedents do not dictate a unique result. Instead, the common law calls for the exercise of judgment, humility, and "cautious empiricism" (p. 40). That is to say, judges should defer to (but avoid being slavishly obedient to) the stored wisdom of society's traditions as well as the track record of what has and has not worked well in the past. Chapter Three is intended to illustrate these general methodological claims by offering a case study of the common law evolution of free speech precedents from Schenck v. United States (1919) to Brandenburg v. Ohio (1969). I found Strauss's concise overview of free speech cases to be illuminating and pitched at just the right level of detail.

Strauss does concede, however, that sometimes it is appropriate to overrule a precedent, and in Chapter Four he turns to examine this difficult question. His central example is Brown v. the Board of Education (1954) and its overruling of the "separate but equal" standard enshrined in Plessy v. Ferguson (1896). This chapter's argument consists in a comparison between the Brown case and the celebrated common law tort case of MacPherson v. Buick Motor Co (1916) in which Judge Benjamin Cardozo rejected the previous legal notion of "privity of contract." At the time of both MacPherson and Brown, argues Strauss, earlier precedents had for a while already been chipping away at the substance of the legal notions that these cases explicitly overturned (i.e., "privity of contract" and "separate but equal," respectively). Hence, according to Strauss, rather than being a sharp break with the past, these cases continued a trend that had already been taking shape in previous court decisions. As a result, Strauss concludes that both such cases, far from being exceptions to the slow evolution of law prized by the common law, in fact exhibit that approach.

If Chapters Two, Three, and Four can be read as Strauss defending living constitutionalism against the charge that it insufficiently disciplines judges, Chapters Five and Six can be read as Strauss's response to the charge that his common law approach to the Constitution renders its text irrelevant. Chapter Five takes up the question of how a living constitutionalist should regard the text of the Constitution, and Chapter Six narrows the focus to a discussion specifically of the textually specified amendment process.

The main idea of Chapter Five is that the text of the Constitution is to be valued for its "common ground function," by which Strauss means its usefulness for achieving a political settlement of matters that have to be settled clearly, one way or another. We need some agreement or other on how old one must be to run for President, for instance, and the text of the Constitution provides an answer (35 years old) on which we can all agree; in that sense the text provides "common ground." This gives Strauss his own distinctive answer to "Jefferson's Problem" -- the problem, recall, of why we should consider ourselves bound in any way to the words of long dead ancestors. Our reason for regarding the text of the Constitution as authoritative does not lie in any kind of duty of obedience owed to the "Founding Fathers"; instead, Strauss says, our reason for regarding the text as authoritative lies in the fact that by so regarding it we can significantly narrow the range of potential disagreement on a host of important issues that, practically speaking, we must resolve in some fashion.

Finally, Chapter Six takes on the critics of living constitutionalism who argue that the amendment process gives the Constitution all the adaptability it needs. Strauss makes two fundamental points in reply. First, he argues that formal amendment is too cumbersome a process to be the only way society can adapt its constitution to changing circumstances. Second, Strauss aims to cast doubt on the alleged historical importance of amendments: either they have little to no practical effect until social understandings have caught up (here he mentions the Fourteenth and Fifteenth Amendments), or they simply ratify a change that has already been widely accepted (as an example Strauss offers the Seventeenth Amendment, which provided for the direct election of senators.)

In a book so short, Strauss does an admirable job supporting his ambitious argument, though inevitably some of his claims receive less support than they deserve (I felt this was particularly true of his chapter on amendments). However, rather than try to document a number of such gaps, I will end this review with an extended look at just one such gap.

This gap lies in a failure to consider a potentially stronger competitor theory than those he rejects. To see this gap, consider a distinction Strauss draws between "rigorous" and "moderate" originalism. Rigorous originalism is the doctrine according to which "the original understandings of constitutional provisions provide answers to every dispute about what the Constitution requires" (p. 25). By contrast, according to moderate originalism, "what is binding is not the original understandings, but instead the principles that the framers or ratifiers of the Constitution were understood to be establishing" (pp. 25-26). Thus, for example, we are to take the First Amendment as enshrining the moral principle of free speech into our country's fundamental law, but judges need not be bound by the eighteenth century understanding of that principle. Strauss criticizes moderate originalism as falling prey to exactly the manipulability complaint that originalists make against living constitutionalism, writing that "Once we say that we are bound only by the principle, rather than by the specific outcomes that the founders envisioned, we can always make the principle abstract enough to justify any result we want to reach" (p. 27).

What, though, if we added to moderate originalism the proviso that the interpretation of the principles in question is to proceed along common law lines, with its respect for precedent? On this understanding, judges are not free simply to write into law their own personal understanding of the principle in question (free speech, say), but must respect the understanding relied upon in earlier court decisions. With this proviso, moderate originalism strikes me as an interesting theory. However, we must ask whether it is a genuine alternative. For would not the addition of this proviso convert moderate originalism into essentially Strauss's own theory of living constitutionalism?

Arguably, no. The difference is apparent in a five page discussion of Roe v. Wade (1973), in which Strauss discusses the Supreme Court's defense of a limited right to abortion rooted in the Due Process Clause of the Fourteenth Amendment. Although Strauss notes some misgivings he has regarding Roe, its invocation of the Due Process Clause is not one of these misgivings. The clause, Strauss observes, has long been used to confer liberty rights. Endorsing this practice, Strauss argues that "two well-established legal traditions" -- namely, a right to bodily integrity and a right to family autonomy -- can be used to construct a limited right to abortion, and "under a common law approach, the long-standing nature of these traditions supports the legitimacy of establishing a constitutional right" (pp. 94-95).

The modified "moderate originalism" defined two paragraphs ago would take a different view. After all, the text of the Due Process Clause makes no mention of bodily integrity and family autonomy; instead, on the most straightforward reading it refers not to a substantive principle of liberty at all, but simply to a principle of due legal procedure. Hence, important though the values of bodily integrity and family autonomy are, this modified moderate originalism -- rejecting as it does any notion of unenumerated rights -- would not regard these values as constitutionally protected by the Due Process Clause. Thus, while the modified theory under consideration would generate a kind of "living constitutionalism" (insofar as it allows constitutional understandings to evolve over time via common law interpretations of enumerated rights and principles), it regards the text as more of a constraint than does Strauss's own living constitutionalism. Perhaps we might call this theory "living textualism."

I mention this alternative theory not necessarily because I believe it to be superior to Strauss's more flexible theory which countenances unenumerated rights. Instead, I mention it because a look at the strengths and weaknesses of living textualism as compared with Strauss's theory would have been illuminating. On the one hand, a case could be made against living textualism on the grounds that it shares some of originalism's implausible results (what case could living textualism make, for instance, for "incorporation," that is, for applying the Bill of Rights to the states as well as the federal government?). On the other hand, a case could be made for living textualism on the grounds that it might have prevented the sort of judicial mischief that arose in the Lochner-era (which takes its name from the key case Lochner v. New York [1905]). During this era the Supreme Court struck down a number of humane and reasonable labor regulations on the grounds that these violated an unenumerated right to "economic liberty" protected by substantive due process. I find it a significant lacuna that Strauss nowhere so much as mentions these Lochner-era abuses of common law reasoning (though presumably it is these that he has in mind when he mentions in passing that the historical usage of the Due Process Clause "is a complicated story" [p. 94]).

However, this complaint of mine must be set against the extraordinary range of insights that Strauss is able to pack into his short and readable book. All things considered, I regard The Living Constitution to be a tremendous success. It deserves to be widely read by students, lay people, and specialists.