The Logic of Commitment

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Gary Chartier, The Logic of Commitment, Routledge, 2018, 102pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138301481.

Reviewed by Kurt Sylvan, University of Southampton


Gary Chartier's Logic of Commitment is the first book-length study of commitment to appear for twenty years (at least under that description).[1] As such it is a welcome addition to the literature on this underexplored topic. And Chartier's angle is distinctive in a way that magnifies the value of his contribution. Best known for a rich body of work in natural law theory and left-libertarian political philosophy, he offers a sidelong perspective on something best discussed in recent years by philosophers of practical reason and moral psychologists. While Chartier's discussion could have been better integrated with that literature in ways I will explain, this shortcoming is matched by the book's strength in complementing work from theorists of practical reason. Philosophers from either theoretical background will be rewarded by committing to reading this short, engaging, and often stylishly written book.

The Introduction briefly unpacks Chartier's understanding of the nature of commitment. Like some of the few other recent writers on this topic -- e.g., Ruth Chang (2013) -- Chartier distinguishes the commitments that interest him from the likes of promises (including promises to oneself): commitments are not essentially moral or essentially made to anyone, and are instead understood as internal conditions of persons bound up with their practical identities. Chartier's distinction is starker than Chang's, however. A commitment for Chartier is characterized in minimal terms as 'a resolution, a plan, a decision, a choice that is treated by the person making it as not to be simply altered at will' (1). This characterization makes commitments sound an awful lot like the resolutions discussed by Richard Holton (2009), and suggests that the book will be a contribution to action theory. But given the connected phenomena that interest Chartier later in the book -- e.g., love, vocation, and the shaping of one's life-story -- it seems plausible that he is directing our attention to the same thing that interests Chang, not merely to Holtonian resolutions, thereby making the book more of a contribution to normative psychology. This reading might explain why Chartier also doesn't cite Holton or some other relevant action theorists (e.g., Michael Bratman).[2] But it invites other questions. After all, theorists like Chang have reasons for denying that a commitment is just a special case of 'a resolution, a plan, a decision [or] a choice', and one might worry that these reasons will threaten Chartier's account.[3]

Of course, as the title suggests, Chartier's book is less about the metaphysics of commitment and more about (i) the reasons for having commitments and the reasons commitment creates, and (ii) the role of commitments in a life, with a focus on their link to love, vocation, and self-constitution. After giving his minimal characterization of commitments in the Introduction, Chartier devotes two chapters to (i) and three chapters to (ii). Before I discuss these engrossing chapters, I want to reflect on the costs of Chartier's way of divvying up the topic. While the metaphysics and normative profile of commitment each merit focus in their own right, there is reason to worry that skimping on a discussion of one could lead to missing out on important aspects of the other. With this concern in mind, the contrast with Chang becomes revealing, and suggests that the Introduction's discussion of the metaphysics of commitment is too brief, even for someone primarily interested in commitment's normative footprint.

Note that Chartier is keen not only to distinguish commitments from promises, but also to deny that the committed person has obligations directed to the object of their commitment that are sustained by its intrinsic features (see esp. p.2). Chang, by contrast, conceives of commitments as a kind of 'internal pledge' that makes certain features of their objects have obligating force. Although the obligation has its source in the will, the reasons that sustain it are intrinsic features of the object, to which one's attention is then owed. Hence, while commitments for Chang needn't be targeted at other persons, they do take the form of a pledge to persons when so directed, and this pledge is normatively sustained by features of these persons. This helps Chang to explain important aspects of the normative profile of committed relationships. Chartier appears to reject this way of thinking when he writes that 'Commitments may concern others, be undertaken in the interests of others; but they are not made to others' (2). While he might respond by denying that he is interested in the same phenomenon as Chang, such a response would make the absence of discussion of Holton and other action theorists objectionable.

This difference with Chang limits Chartier's explanatory resources, as I will explain in considering his discussions of vocation and love. But it also explains the limited scope of his discussion of reasons for commitment. The relevant chapters concern what Pamela Hieronymi (2005) calls extrinsic reasons for commitment (or what other theorists call state-given reasons). It is, however, hard to believe that the only distinctive reasons for commitment are extrinsic, especially if commitment is not meant just to be Holtonian resolution. It is also hard to know what to do with these reasons. While some attitudes like imagination can be formed for extrinsic reasons, others -- precisely those that Hieronymi singles out as involving commitment! -- cannot. Some special cases of commitment -- especially the commitments involved in relationships -- seem decidedly unlike imagination in this regard. One can't commit to Harry without conceiving of his interests as giving special reasons for you to act in certain ways. Although the force of these reasons may partly have its source in the will if Chang is right, the reasons themselves are not extrinsic. They are constituted by intrinsic features of the object of commitment, though their special force is unlocked by the act of commitment. Chartier's metaphysics of commitment makes it difficult to understand how there could be such distinctive reasons. Yet these are arguably the most important reasons -- perhaps the only reasons of the right kind -- for commitment.[4]

Still, Chartier's discussion of his extrinsic reasons is captivating, and provides a strong case for wanting to have commitments, if not for being committed to anything in particular. Chapter 1 surveys a legion of instrumental reasons. Some of these advance specific goals, by helping one to tie oneself to the mast and 'contributing causally . . . to the formation of the disposition to adhere to whatever plan is embodied in the commitment' (11). This group subdivides into two categories. Firstly, there are reasons of 'ex ante self-cultivation' (12), in which one imposes penalties on defection from the cause and trains oneself into the sort of person who keeps commitments. These reasons may not, however, be strong enough to override contrary preferences in particular moments of temptation. For this reason, Chartier mentions a second set of 'ex post' reasons that include looking to past commitments for motivation or -- following Nozick (1993: 17-19) -- symbolically treating any instance of backsliding as tantamount to wholesale defection.

Even these reasons, however, may need supplementation from a second class of instrumental reasons: reasons for adhering to commitments as such, independently of particular objectives. On this topic, Chartier's discussion is at times reminiscent of Holton's treatment of resolutions and weakness of will. He does, however, suggest that keeping commitments in one case increases the likelihood of keeping them in others, which may conflict with Holton's thought that resolutions drain the mental power on which they rely. Here some engagement with the empirical literature would have been useful. Still, the chapter follows up with plenty of other general reasons for keeping commitments, such as the social value of doing so and the benefits of being perceived as reliable, both by others and oneself.

Chapter 1's salad bar of instrumental reasons is followed by a more concentrated discussion of the value of commitment for self-integration. Self-integration is understood as a matter of maintaining the 'inner consistency of one's life story and of one's choices' (21). Chartier regards this as an aspect of well-being, and hence suggests that there is always something 'appealing' about following through with one's commitments. Chartier isn't fully satisfied with the contribution to well-being, however. For he doesn't think it explains why it is irrational to decline to stick to particular commitments (22). Hence, Chartier looks to Bernard Williams's ground projects to help explain why it would be unreasonable to abandon some commitments: it does seem irrational to abandon what gives one's life meaning, even in the face of strong temptation. This heavyweight reason is followed up in the final two main sections by more humdrum considerations: (i) failure is bad, and (ii) there is more reason to make and keep commitments than to not make them, make them and ignore them, or change them sporadically (29).

While Chapter 3's title ('Commitment and Basic Goods') suggests a turn away from the self, the main additional reason it offers is that 'Commitments help to define the self through participation in particular goods while enabling us to participate in basic goods deeply and richly' (41). This theme is reminiscent of Chang (2009)'s idea that voluntarist reasons are needed to help settle 'hard choices' between goods that are 'on a par'. Indeed, much of the chapter is about incommensurability, another Changian topic. It could have benefited from distinctions well-known from Chang's work, like the distinction between incommensurability (lack of a cardinal unit by which values can be measured) and incomparability (the inability to be ordinally compared relative to a covering value). Chartier seems to elide this distinction in passages that reason from incommensurability to the failure of objective comparativist reasoning (see esp. p.40). He does, however, later acknowledge that comparisons might still be made given one's commitments: 'treating basic aspects of well-being as incommensurable is quite compatible with comparing and weighing these aspects of well-being [, but] when one is doing so, one isn't employing weights that just anyone would be unreasonable not to employ.' But for Chartier these comparisons are, at bottom, subjective, not justified by the object of commitment. The fact of commitment is the reason for Chartier: 'I need a reason for [adhering to one option] that doesn't involve the mistaken belief that the values it embodies objectively outweigh those embodied by other options. The fact that I've committed provides just such a reason' (42). It is a shame that little is done to justify preferring this option to the one in Chang (2013) and Errol Lord (2016), where the commitment is not the reason but rather the background condition on the additional weight attaching to features of the object.

Ultimately, a third option that grounds the reasons more fully in the object of commitment might be preferable, and some of Chartier's remarks earlier in the chapter are suggestive. As he emphasizes, commitments enable us to correctly respond to some basic values: 'they enable us to participate in all the other real goods in a distinctive way . . . [and] enable us to discover what these genuine aspects of well-being are actually made of' (41). Granting the vast plurality of basic goods Chartier recognizes, it will be impossible for limited creatures like us to correctly respond to everything of fundamental value. Yet all basic values invite full commitment. If this is right, there are sufficient object-given reasons for commitment that are also, given our limitations, reasons for partiality. On this picture, the justification for staying committed to a value in a way that excludes the possibility of participating in others is constituted by the object of commitment rather than the fact of commitment, where our limitations imply that responding to this reason will involve partiality.[5] The core reason for commitment on this view isn't voluntarist: what justifies is not the fact of commitment but rather the object's practically bottomless inherent value. It generates objective reasons that -- when scaled by our limitations -- end up being possessed as justifiers of partiality. Chartier seems to appreciate these reasons, but the story he emphasizes seems more like the voluntarist's.

The final two chapters of Chartier's book turn us to some of its most distinctive and engaging ideas, and at times reflect the influence of the natural law tradition he mentions throughout as his theoretical backdrop. Chapter 4 discusses the relationship between commitment and vocation understood in a way more reminiscent of the idea of a divine calling than the ordinary occupational concept. The chapter begins with an attempt to contrast vocations and commitments, but ends with the thought that they are more similar than they might have first appeared. The alleged difference emphasized at the start of the chapter is that 'a commitment seems to be an exercise in self-creation', while a vocation 'seems to be something one accepts' (57) and 'seems to come from outside' (58). Chartier then considers several grounds for the normativity of vocation that come from outside, and deems them all inadequate. This leads him to suspect that we need to make the normativity of vocation out to be more like the normativity of commitment, and to take the fundamental calling to be (to use Jonathan Dancy's terms) enticing rather than peremptory (with the felt peremptory force added on after the fact of commitment).

I think Chartier doesn't sufficiently consider the possibility of running the reduction in the opposite direction, which would appeal to the 'callings' of the basic values he discussed in the previous chapter. This possibility isn't registered among his list of ways of grounding the normativity of vocation. Admittedly, this direction of reduction might seem to make commitment 'normatively superfluous'. But the fact of commitment could still be acknowledged as generating rational pressures, where these pressures simply lack objective normative significance unless one commits to something objectively worthy of commitment. Even if commitments are superfluous from the perspective of objective reason, they could remain an essential part of the story of rational obligation.

Chapter 5 rounds off the substance of the book with a dense and wide-ranging discussion of love. Love is described -- rather controversially, and without much argument -- as 'a decision, the will to form a we with the other' (68), and hence qualifies as a commitment in its own right by the Introduction's gloss. This fact muddies some of the discussion early in the chapter. One early part seeks to explain how commitment can prove 'persistently relevant' in sustaining love amidst the shifting feelings of an imperfect heart. This description gives the impression that commitment should be added to buttress love, which might otherwise face 'corrosion' owing to 'the fickleness of hearts, including one's own' (71), where such fickleness might include 'anything from boredom to responsiveness to the charms of another potential lover'. One might have thought love was buttressed against such fickleness by its constitution, in contrast to mere liking and infatuation.

After explaining how commitment secures responsiveness to the beloved's value, Chartier turns first to some remarks about the value of commitment for personal growth and self-constitution, and then to a discussion of the wavering lover's eyeing of other potential inamoratas. In the second discussion, he invokes the incommensurability of the values that make love fitting to justify anti-comparativist conclusions; this again needs defense, given Chang's efforts to prize the issues apart. Chartier's reasoning in an ensuing section on the costliness of maintaining a loving relationship also runs into tensions with Chang's defense of comparativism: he reasons from the alleged incommensurability of the goods in two potential relationships to the reasonableness of preferring a shorter relationship with the one person to a longer relationship with another 'no matter what goods the other person offers or embodies' (79), and even when the lover values a relationship's length as such.

The rest of the chapter is devoted to commitment's role in 'wooing' (a word I'd never encountered so often in a philosophy book!), in reconnecting with one's ex, and in long-term relationships. At this point, one might be forgiven for feeling that Chartier spreads his attention too thin. The coverage felt rushed. There seemed to be at least two chapters worth of ideas. The cost of committing to a second wouldn't have been great, given the brevity of the book.

The book concludes with a coda that repeats its main messages and underscores in a concluding paragraph the importance of commitments for flourishing through 'self-cultivation and self-creation'. While the chapter on love had drawn attention to object-given reasons for one kind of commitment, this conclusion shifts it back to the extrinsic or state-given reasons on which so much of the book focused. One is left with the strong impression that Chartier regards these as the most important reasons. While I've raised some doubts about this emphasis, it exemplifies the novel perspective that makes the book a pathbreaking contribution to the topic.


Chang, R. 2009. 'Voluntarist Reasons and the Sources of Normativity' in Sobel, D. and Wall, S. (eds.) Reasons for Action. Cambridge University Press.

Chang, R. 2013. 'Commitment, Reasons, and the Will.' Oxford Studies in Metaethics 8: 74-113.

Hieronymi, P. 2005. 'The Wrong Kind of Reason.'

Holton, R. 2009. Willing, Wanting, Waiting. Oxford University Press.

Keller, S. 2013. Partiality. Princeton University Press.

Lieberman, M. 1997. Commitment, Value, and Moral Realism. Cambridge University Press.

Lord, E. 2016. 'Justifying Partiality.' Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 19: 569-590.

Nozick, R. 1993. The Nature of Rationality. Princeton University Press.

Robins, M. 1984. Promising, Intending, and Moral Autonomy. Cambridge University Press.

[1] Two important earlier studies are Robins (1984) and Lieberman (1998).

[2] Though it is worth noting that neither Chang's paper nor the other two book-length studies of commitment are cited.

[3] For Chang's criticisms, see her (2013: 86-92).

[4] Admittedly, there remains a puzzle about these reasons: how can they be both intrinsic and have their source in the will? Chang's answer is that the reason is an intrinsic feature with some 'given' weight and power to obligate, but that the special weight for you is unlocked by the commitment, which serves as a background condition rather than part of the reason. For a related view, see Lord (2016).

[5] One might view this story as a generalization of Keller (2013)'s view about partiality to other people.