The Logic of Information: A Theory of Philosophy as Conceptual Design

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Luciano Floridi, The Logic of Information: A Theory of Philosophy as Conceptual Design, Oxford University Press, 2019, 240pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198833635.

Reviewed by Carlo Penco, University of Genoa, and Margherita Benzi, University of Eastern Piedmont


Luciano Floridi elucidated and popularized the ideas of Infosphere, Philosophy of information, The Ethics of Information and Fourth Revolution. The present book has a more ambitious program then the previous ones: a proposed new foundation for philosophy. With Descartes and Kant, epistemology became central replacing the old Aristotelian metaphysics. With Frege's and Wittgenstein's linguistic turn, logic, in the form of a theory of meaning, became central as Dummett and Davidson suggested. With Williamson, metaphysics was again central. Floridi suggests abandoning any representationalist view in order to develop a philosophy of information as conceptual design. Is this a real revolution or just proposing old ideas in a new form? Actually, Rorty had already attacked the centrality of the "representational view" of philosophy in Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. The new terminology, "conceptual design", seems simply a development of Dummett's view that: "the philosopher's own resource is the analysis of concepts we already possess" (p. 18). Therefore, besides the analogy with the principle of design in architecture (analysed in chapter 10 and applied to system engineering on  pp. 298 ff.), Floridi's view of philosophy as conceptual design seems to place philosophy on traditional grounds as the "art of identifying and clarifying open questions and of devising, refining, proposing and evaluating explanatory answers". Philosophy is a set of open questions: questions open to informed and rational disagreement, in contrast with questions that -- like empirical and logico-mathematical questions -- may have definite answers based on observations and calculations. At first sight, then, we haven't a great revolution, but ideas framed in an original way, with subtle remarks on Plato's negative influence on philosophy on the one hand and big data analysis on the other.

Floridi's general introduction to philosophical method is decidedly fascinating. According to Floridi, Plato was wrong to claim that the user of an artifact knows it better than its maker (Cratylus 390b-d). Certainly Plato was unaware of the social biases of his age. He took for granted as "utterly obvious and uncontroversial that an artisan could never possibly qualify as a knower with respect to its artifacts" (p. 32). Think of the cobbler who makes reins and a bit and the horseman who uses them: the genuine knower is the horseman who understands how to use them. Yet Plato hinted at a different possibility, speaking of a kind of knowledge (episteme) that combines "both how to make something and how to use what is made", against the mere doxa of representations. He did not, however, follow this remarkable intuition, and therefore techne and episteme, practical and theoretical knowledge, started moving apart. But, Floridi comments, "it is difficult to follow Plato when he holds that users know their iPhone better than Apple", and further:

Who, if not a philosopher, could believe and argue that the maker of an artefact knows it less well than its user? Try that next time your car breaks down and needs to be repaired. Plato was right in stressing the importance of both kinds of knowledge, and he was wrong to argue that the user's knowledge should be preferred to the maker's. (p. 35)

Starting from this Platonic tradition, philosophers considered knowledge a passive process of discovery, although there were some exceptions (e.g., Francis Bacon). Contrary to the representational view of the world, knowledge is acquired through the creation of the right sort of semantic artefacts; it is "information modelling": "we are the builders of the infosphere we inhabit, Bacon's 'intellectual globe'" (p. 36).

The fight against representationalism seems to contrast with Floridi's many references to Kant. Floridi's Kant, unlike Rorty's, is not the promoter of a representational view of philosophy, but is rather the originator of a constructionist view, which helps to face the ambiguity of naturalism. On the one hand, science is committed to a healthy naturalistic method for which explanations of natural phenomena should always be presented in terms of what is given by natural sciences. On the other hand, science depends on technologies that are 'denaturalizing' the world or what qualifies as real: "the ultimate explanation of the natural seems to rely upon and to promote the development of the artificial, seen as an instantiation of the non-natural" (p. 53). In a long discussion on naturalism, Floridi arrives at a conclusion that bears some analogy to the one proposed by McDowell. While for McDowell we build in the linguistic community a "second nature", according to Floridi "the non-natural is our first nature, and the natural is actually our second nature. And this means that what we need is a genealogy of the natural from the non-natural, not vice-versa" (p. 67).

Moving on from Floridi's constructionist philosophy, consider what the reader finds in this book that was not in his previous ones. There is a heterogeneity of new topics. This is a possible drawback. It requires that the reader have more background than normally necessary in a supposedly self-contained book, but bear in mind that the book is not an Introduction. We will comment on some of the volume's main issues, mainly treated in chapters 4, 5, 7, 8, and 10. We won't discuss other interesting themes given our space limitation, but will offer a hint about two of them.  In chapter 6, Floridi reconstructs the sceptical challenge as informational scepticism (with the provocative conclusion that there is "nothing to be epistemically worried about calling the real virtual, or the virtual real, if the two are identical" p. 146). In chapter 9, he reconstructs the debate on the classical dichotomies of apriori-aposteriori, analytic-synthetic, and necessary-contingent, with the insertion of the dichotomy uninformative-informative in order to present a view of the maker's knowledge as "weak a priori".

Now let us turn to the main issues.on which we've chosen to focus.

(1) First we find answers to criticisms against an informational analysis of knowledge. Tommaso Piazza suggested that "knowledge could not, at least not in general, be analysed as accounted information" because no accounting of information can explain the epistemic status of such direct means of acquiring knowledge as perception and testimony (p. 73). Floridi's answer is that perception and testimony are not yet knowledge, but are "data providers". They do not generate propositional semantic information of themselves. A proper understanding is only obtained through an accounting of the available semantic information. Knowledge only comes once data become "encodable resources, exploitable by agents through some language broadly conceived" (p. 83).

(2) What really is information quality? In our entire history, before digitalization, we accumulated approximately 12 exabytes of data (an exabyte is one billion gigabytes). By 2011, we overcame the zettabyte (1,000 exabytes) barrier and by 2020 we shall have arrived at 44 zettabytes. What saves us are some trillions of ICT systems "constantly working to keep us afloat and navigate through such an ocean of data" (p. 102). Yet emphasizing acquiring large amounts of data runs the risk of overlooking the quality of information (and introduces the problem of what to delete). Information quality (IQ) depends on categories used to define IQ dimensions (Intrinsicness, Accessibility, Contextuality, Representation). There are many ways to define these dimensions and taxonomies. Trouble arises, however, from some basic issues often connected with big data. These mainly include a failure to identify the level of abstraction at which the data are analysed or used following the choice of a purpose, and therefore the risk of missing the re-purposable nature of information. The problem is particularly worrisome because users' expectations are unpredictable and data may always be re-purposed, for evil ends. Consider, for example, the Holocaust in the Netherlands: 74% of the Jews living in Netherlands died, the highest death toll in any Western country including Germany. Why? The Netherlands had an excellent census, which provided accurate and reliable information, used for deviant purposes not thought of  before. Floridi insists on distinguishing carefully between purposes for which information is produced and purposes for which it may be consumed -- and repurposed. We always should link IQ to a specific purpose, at a specific level of abstraction, instead of talking of IQ in absolute terms, as it is still often presented today.  We should also consider the possible degenerate purposes for which the same information might be put to use.

(3) Floridi criticises the denial of the principle of information closure (PIC): Ip & I(pq)) → Iq, to be read as: If S is informed that p and is informed that if p then q, then S is informed that q. PIC is similar to a principle of modal logic, but instead of the operator of necessity, we have the operator "I" of "being informed" or "holding the information". PIC has been criticized for being subject to a radical sceptical challenge and many, following Dretske, argue that we should reject it. The discussion is sophisticated and a simple example suggests Floridi's stance on it. Let us assume that you have in your pocket the information that on Sunday supermarkets are closed, and your smartphone tells you that it is Sunday. Do you hold the information that the supermarket is closed today? Yes and no. If you fail to notice either the note in your pocket or the date on your smartphone, you certainly do not hold the information. However, as a matter of logic, in terms of feasibility, normativity or sufficient procedures for information extraction, you did have all the information needed. If you go to the supermarket and find it closed, you may realize that, if you had been more careful, you would have known. Conclusion: PIC is correct, although you may lack the resources to extract the relevant information, which is, however, logically extractable. Consequences: if PIC is acceptable, then also the axiom of distribution is, given that it is logically equivalent to PIC. But the axiom [Nec (φ → ψ) → (Nec φ → Nec ψ)] characterizes normal modal logics and, contrary to those who reject PIC, we may still use normal modal logics for the logic of information.

(4) On logical fallacies as inferences to the best explanation there is abundant literature. Floridi develops the suggestion that, instead of interpreting logical arguments in terms of argumentative or dialectical strength, we may interpret them in terms of information-gathering and gain. In this setting, using Bayes' theorem, when probabilities are so low as to be negligible ("degraded Bayes' theorem"), we may then take logical fallacies as Bayesian quick and dirty information shortcuts: the bet might be risky (it might be wrong), but it often pays off (p. 167). We enlarge in this way the range of "incorrect forms of reasoning" or sub-optimal ways of reasoning. Following the tradition of heuristic and biases, some fallacies (like affirming the consequence) can be evaluated as powerful information tools, "provided one is aware of epistemic risks one is running" (p. 70). It is difficult to disagree, especially on the epistemic risk, but we should also stress that cases of degraded Bayes' theorem are a small subset of normal cases (they happen only when there is a low probability of false positives), and although we may sometimes use Bayesian shortcuts for extracting information, we cannot use them in building information (where database consistency checkers are required).

(5) The title of the book is misleading. Floridi speaks of logic in different ways, discussing technical aspects of modal logics. However, the main point of the book does not concern logic proper, but a conception of "logic" as general methodology. Logic is intended as design of conceptual structures, as specification of requirements needed to satisfy certain purposes (reminiscent of the discussion about the phases of architectural design on p. 198). Yet there is a short attempt to define logic as the relation between a set of requirements [R1, . . ., Rn] and a system S that implements them. The logic would define a new kind of inference that is neither deduction nor abduction: the set of requirement "conduces" to the system, as a sufficient solution for the purpose in question. A fridge does not necessitate "preserving food", but this requirement makes the fridge a sufficient solution. We need a logic of design as a logic of requirements, and philosophy should equip itself with one. Well, probably, this is just a not yet developed proposal, but some interesting analogies with FOL show that the concept of "conduction" may help choosing among different sets of requirement depending on their logical structure (see p. 201-205).

Eventually, do we really need to "reboot" philosophy, as Floridi asks in light of what he defines as "scholasticism"? Are we in a situation similar to that of medieval culture when it was about to be devastated by the scientific revolution? Can we really find a universal key in the notion of information, as was once the case with the notion of understanding and reason (Kant) or with the notion of language (Wittgenstein)? Floridi's idea of "rebooting" is very provocative: we should abandon a lot of philosophical debates, and their "jargon", that are intolerant to intellectual novelties just as some scholars did when confronted with the scientific revolution in the XVII century. However, what Floridi calls "jargon" is often the technical aspect of philosophical debates that are not necessarily cut off from digital technologies and information revolution. Maybe in these debates philosophers are treating aspects that might be of use in unpredictable ways (as in the passage from semantic web to a pragmatic web). Certainly the philosophy of information may have a strong impact on different branches of philosophy, but -- let us admit -- the contrary may also happen. Actually, many research programs in philosophy are already engaged in the topics of the fourth revolution. Maybe, instead of contraposing the so-called scholasticism of contemporary philosophy to the new philosophy of information, it would be wiser to search for and find possible ways of interaction.

Finally, a few brief commments. Floridi's book is for those already familiar with the topics and their subtleties. At times, however, a  fuller discussion would have been helpful. Following are a few examples, The reader might wonder whether the discussion of causation (pp. 96-7)  is a change of perspective from the one in Floridi's Philosophy of Information (pp. 246-7). The role of small data is a very hot topic today, but a definitions of small patterns and some examples could be included. Speaking always of a King of clubs and a Queen of spades, it would be nice not to have pictures of a King of spades and a Queen of clubs. "Minimalism" is used in standard ways both in truth theory and philosophy of language;  a quick summary of the standard uses might be useful. Finally, an error in the book's References: Floridi 2010b at page xiv-xv should be Floridi 2010a.