The Logic of Number

Logic Of Number

Neil Tennant, The Logic of Number, Oxford University Press, 2022, 363pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192846679.


Reviewed by Will Stafford, University of Bristol


The logicist provides a foundation for mathematics by introducing abstraction principles of a new kind, in natural-deduction form, that can effectively capture the objects in the domain being discussed. The present book proposes three abstraction principles, one for natural numbers, one for the rational numbers, and one for the real numbers. Through direct exposition and illustrative examples, a case is made in favour of adopting these abstraction principles.

The book adopts a unique approach to logicism, which it calls “natural logicism” due to its use of Gentzen-style natural deduction rules. It aims to develop rules that satisfy the criteria of harmony between introduction and elimination rules, that has developed from Gerhard Gentzen’s work. This leads to an important distinction (for each kind of number) between the abstraction principle, which is an introduction rule for the abstraction operator and the abstraction schema which is proven from that rule. More traditional approaches to neologicism simply stipulate abstraction schema. But here it is the abstraction principle as introduction rule that come first and incurs a commitment to the existence of numbers.

The method of the book is described as logico-genetic theorizing because it aims to show why a rational being is entitled to their conception of the numbers and the assumption that such things exist without presuming a prior understanding of the topic. The abstraction principles for natural and rational numbers are in line with traditional approaches. But, to save the character of the reals, the final section of the book moves away from this picture to one that puts an emphasis on geometrical intuition.

To illustrate both these points, we can consider the natural numbers. There is what the author calls a “single-barrelled” Introduction rule for the abstraction operator # for natural numbers. From this is derived Schema N (see Tennant (1987), Chapter 20, at p.234):

the number of x such that Fx = if and only if there are exactly n Fs.

The right-hand side of this equivalence is defined in such a way as not to incur any commitment to the existence of the number n. The left-hand side “recarves” the content of the right-hand side, to incur commitment to natural numbers.

This is a “single-barrelled” abstraction principle, which, rather than giving truth conditions for an identity statement involving two abstraction terms:

#xFx = #xGx

(as is done by Crispin Wright, following Frege), gives the truth-conditions for an identity statement involving an abstraction term on one side, and a singular term t in general on the other:


It is worth noting that the abstraction principle (i.e., the Introduction rule) for # is single-barrelled because # appears only on one side of the identity that is its conclusion.

The book also proves sufficient mathematics from the definitions to demonstrate that the relevant area of mathematics may be accounted for.

The book is admirably low in technical material for the topics covered and large parts will be readily comprehensible to those who might otherwise be concerned that they cannot recall enough logic for the task. Additionally, the book provides historical context for the topics covered, expanding the audience who may find something of value here. The book is organised into four sections, with the first outlining the general project and the subsequent three dedicated to the abstraction principles and their associated Schemas. This review will discuss the general program of each of the three later sections, rather than go chapter by chapter.

Section 1: the Naturals

Neil Tennant is, to this reviewer’s knowledge, the only person who has articulated a very natural idea: that one might combine proof-theoretic semantics and logicism. The section on the natural numbers attempts to do so within the background of core logic, which should satisfy those committed to stronger logics as well. This view is a refinement of Tennant (1987).

This is achieved, as noted above, via deriving all instances of Schema N:

#xFx =  ṉ ↔ nxFx

It is shown that the axioms of PA can be recovered from the natural-deduction rules for zero, successor, and # using only core logic. The author has developed a method for recovering addition and multiplication elsewhere (Tennant 2009).

Section 2: Rationals

The book presents a unique approach to the rational numbers, as Tennant believes they deserve their own presentation. Stewart Shapiro’s approach is rejected because it implies the existence of division by zero and assumes prior knowledge of multiplication. Instead, Tennant aims to present the rationals using pre-mathematical resources and the natural numbers constructed in the earlier section.

The ingenious approach taken is to adopt mereology (a theory of part whole relations) as a background. Tennant (2013) has shown that mereology can be treated in Gentzen’s style with harmonious rules (see also Maffezioli 2016). Once this is in place, a novel approach to the logicality of the rational numbers is presented.

The strategy is illustrated by the example of a precocious young boy who, despite knowing little mathematics other than geometry, is interested in fairly dividing pizza among his friends. In doing so he has to understand the idea that one thing can be separated into equal parts. This scenario represents an important order of ideas (rather than the actual order of learning for children) emphasising that division of objects is not primarily a mathematical issue but rather a question of logical possibility.

The rationals are taken to be the abstracts of divisions of one group between another, which may require breaking members of the first group into their parts (hence the mereology). This approach captures the applicability of the rationals and their difference from the reals (dividing vs measuring). The resulting abstraction schema is:

ℑx(t,xOwhole O) = p:q ⊣⊢ q copies of the parts t p copies of the whole O

Here, t is the parts of O whose fraction we wish to measure (so if we were dividing three pizzas by 6 people, t would be three pieces of a pizza which has been divided into 6). We can then read this schema, using the example, as saying on the right-hand side that 6 copies of 3 pieces of pizza are mereologically equivalent to 3 whole pizzas. The left-hand side then gives us the fraction 3:6 as equal to ℑx(t,xpizzawhole pizza). This expression should be read as the fraction of the whole pizza that t represents.

Section 3: Reals

The largest section of the book is devoted to developing and defending an approach to the reals. Tennant lays out four requirements for any account of the reals:

  1. It should explain the applicability of the reals.
  2. The naturals and rationals should be identical to their real counterparts.
  3. Basic laws about the reals should be derivable from it.
  4. There should be uncountably many reals.

It is commendable that Tennant takes the requirement that there are uncountably many reals seriously. The deductive weakness of core logic provides the possibility of giving a definition of the reals that has them being countable from an external perspective but uncountable in the system because the function which aligns them one-to-one with the naturals is undefinable. But this strategy is rejected.

At the heart of Tennant’s strategy is a rejection of the arithmetization of the reals and a return to a more geometric approach. He argues against the philosophical grounds for arithmetization by rejecting the reasons given by Bernard Bolzano and Richard Dedekind. He also draws on the idea of pure proofs, which might seem in line with Tennant’s endorsement of Gentzen’s approach. However, he instead argues for proof purity being an unattainable goal due to independence and incompleteness results.

It is argued that the correct view of the reals is to see it as the measure of a dimension by some unit (think length, duration, weight, etc.) This leads to the abstraction schema:

x(t,xu) = r⊣⊢t is r u of D

The intended reading of the right-hand side expression is “t is composed of exactly r units u of dimension D,” for example, “the diagonal of the unit square is exactly √2 units in length.” The left-hand side reifies this to “the real number of units u that measure t = r,” for example, “the real number of units of length that measure the unit square = √2'.” Including dimension in the schema ensures that the first requirement is met: These are applicable real numbers.

This schema is taken together with a view of reals as bicimals. That is, a real number can be reached by an infinite sequence of divisions of the dimension measured. Tennant uses length as a paradigm, and I will too from now on. So, if we have a point on a line, we can find the real corresponding to it by splitting the line in half and giving the left half the label 0 and the right 1. By continuing this process, we end up with a binary expansion of the real number (e.g., 0.1001001010. . .). By considering all such infinite sequences, Tennant ensures we are talking about the uncountable entirety of the reals, thereby satisfying point 4. The last few chapters of the book develop work on sequences to demonstrate that the approach provides a route to mathematics, thereby satisfying point 3.

Overall, the approach offered here is a promising one, but some questions and challenges remain. The book emphasises the fact that the natural numbers are embedded in the rationals and the rationals in the reals (condition 2 above). This is a laudable goal, but it is unclear how it is accomplished. Achieving it would require an identity between the abstraction terms of different schema or it would need to be stipulated that the canonical notations refer to the same thing. Tennant rightly points out a natural correspondence, such as how dividing one pizza by one person yields one pizza. But this does not explain the identity of the two numbers. To put this in the notation of the book: if we consider the measuring of a line l where it turns out that l contains exactly 3 units, then #x(l,x=u)=3/1 and #{x|x is a unit of u measuring l}=3, but apart from the intuitive similarity it is not clear why #x(l,x=u)= #{x|x is a unit of u measuring l} holds.

Further, the relationship between the bicimal expansions and the abstraction schema is not entirely clear. If we interpret “t is r u of D” in some believable regimentation of our language, then there will be only countably many instances of it. As such, the schema, unlike the bicimal expansion, appears to explain only a countable collection of reals. However, the bicimals are supposed to be the natural logicist’s chosen representation of the reals. This implies that there should be uncountably many instances and that many of these instances contain infinite strings. This presents a challenge to maintaining the spirit of the Gentzen-style approach. While Tennant uses single-barrelled abstraction principles to very good effect, one might wonder if this is a case where their use is detrimental as we are forced to have a term for each of the reals in our language.

In summary, the book represents a serious and important contribution to the logicist project. It leaves several important questions open but gives sufficient reason to think that these questions are worth pursuing further. Perhaps, with the view laid out systematically in the book, this logicist approach will finally receive the attention it deserves.


Maffezioli, P. (2016). Analytic Rules for Mereology. Studia Logica, 140(1), 79–114.

Tennant, N. (1987). Anti-Realism and Logic: Truth as Eternal. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Tennant, N. (2009). Natural Logicism via the Logic of Orderly Pairing . In S. Lindström, E. Palmgren, K. Segerberg, & V. Stoltenberg-Hansen, Logicism, Intuitionism, Formalism: What has become of them? 91–125, Verlag: Springer.

Tennant, N. (2013). Parts, Classes and Parts of Classes: An Anti-Realist Reading of Lewesian Mereology. Synthese, 190(4), 709–742.