Purgatory: The Logic of Total Transformation

Placeholder book cover

Jerry Walls, Purgatory: The Logic of Total Transformation, Oxford University Press, 2011, 211pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199732296.

Reviewed by Keith E. Yandell, University of Wisconsin, Madison


Having written on heaven and hell, Prof. Walls completes a trilogy with a book on purgatory. Historically informed, philosophically competent, and theologically alert, the result is an impressive book. His goal is not to prove that a doctrine of purgatory is true. It is to suggest that, on a given understanding of purgatory, the Scriptures do not conflict with it, core Christian doctrines are not inconsistent with it, and grace is not negated by it. Instead, grace is fulfilled through it. My purpose throughout this review is to present Wall's excellent discussion in a manner fair to its complexity and subtlety.

That the doctrine of purgatory has any biblical basis is disputed. Among proposed supporting texts are Matthew 12:40 (as Jonah was in the belly of the whale for three days and nights, the Son of Man will be in the heart of the earth three days and three nights), Acts 2:31 (Jesus was not abandoned in Hades nor did his flesh see corruption), Romans 10:7 (who will descend to the abyss to bring Christ back from the dead?), Ephesians 4:10 (and if he ascended what does this mean but that he descended to the lower regions of the earth?), and I Peter 3:18 (Jesus (was) made alive by the Spirit, by whom he preached to the spirits in prison). Such texts do not demand a purgatorial reading, but they have suggested this reading to purgatory's supporters.

Generally, the Protestant attitude regarding the idea of purgatory has been less than welcoming. Purgatory has been seen as unbiblical, a denial of the sufficiency of the work of Christ on our behalf, a post-mortem version of salvation by works, and thus being wholly out of place in Christian theology. All of this holds, even without the sale of indulgences and the proposed role of demons as the purveyors of purgatorial pain. As Hebrews 9:27 says, it is appointed to man once to die, and after this (comes) the judgment. No possible post-mortem second chance is mentioned. No period of probation, punishment, or purification is specified. Were there such a period, it would have been mentioned. So (on the common Protestant view) purgatory is a Catholic invention that we do not find in scripture. Nonetheless such recent and contemporary Protestants as Forsyth, Moltmann, Pannenberg, and Polkinghorne have expressed sympathy for a doctrine of purgatory. It is important for Walls that his proposal regarding purgatory have ecumenical interest.

Fully aware of how widespread the negative attitude is, Walls seeks to show that it is unjustified. He grants that appeal to biblical exegesis will not suffice to justify the doctrine of purgatory as based in sacred text. He adds that exegesis also does not justify rejecting the doctrine. He surveys the history of the idea and considers the theological and philosophical merits of a refined version of the doctrine. This requires a nuanced view of just what purgatory is supposed to be.

Purgatory, Walls informs us, is sometimes viewed as purely punitive. At death we may have sins that have not received their due recompense. Better that we meet that recompense in purgatory than in hell. Purgatory is the rather less than delightful waiting room for heaven in which one's sins are finally punished so that entry into heaven is possible. It is this proposal that understandably has seemed to deny the efficacy of Christ's work and the fullness of grace.

Sometimes, particularly in its later versions, the idea either combines punitive and purificational elements, or is restricted to purification. The idea, especially of the latter, is that even the sincerest believers have not attained the perfection required for dwelling in heaven. Hence it seems natural to believe that there is a period between demise and entry into heaven such as that provided by purificational purgatory.

As always, there are objections. Why can't God just perfect believers upon their death, and then no purgatorial purification will be needed? An answer with which Walls has considerable sympathy is that purification is necessarily a process that the person being purified must go through rather than a quick event the person undergoes. This is reminiscent of Aristotle's 'one swallow does not make a summer' remark -- virtues (and vices) develop via voluntary decisions over time.

It seems natural to associate the notion of libertarian freedom with that of purificational purgatory. A believer who is not ready to enjoy fellowship in heaven lives in company with others in the same situation, and through proper free choices engages in actions that progressively reduce her evil dispositions and strengthen her good dispositions. These mingle with appropriate repentance and contrition. The process may be painful, but is so only because there is no rosy road to final sanctification. Finally the purgatory dweller's character has changed sufficiently that she will be at home in heaven. Heaven would be hell for the unrepentant and unpleasant for the unpurified.

Of course God could deterministically arrange things so that a corresponding process occurred in the absence of free choices. This would raise the question of why God does not just determine people's choices and actions so that they become morally perfect, as well as the question of whether 'determined virtue' is not a contradiction in terms. These are controversial matters, as is the assumption that we have libertarian freedom and must have it in order to be moral agents. The existence of libertarian freedom is an assumption of Wallsian purgatory.

Another assumption is that the imperfect cannot enter heaven. Few, if any, among us have reached perfection when we die. If there is a purificatory purgatory, it will not want for populace. As noted, there is also the view that purification takes time -- is a process that requires the continued willing participation of the person being purified.

There is also the question of whether there are 'second chances' -- whether one who has died an unbeliever can become a believer in a post-mortem existence. The argument for this is that a God of love will do anything short of overriding our freedom to bring us to the sort of relationship that God wishes for us all. This question is in one way separable from the question of purgatorial perfection for those who are pre-mortem believers. One could argue that God's love is expressed through purgatorial perfection without its also being expressed through second chances. Acceptance of the notion of second chances gives support for the idea of a purgatory whose purpose goes beyond purification.

Walls notes both that other cultures (Egyptian, Indian, Persian, Babylonian, Greek, Jewish) have ideas similar to that of purgatory and that this fact has at least two opposite interpretations. One is the old standard (and still active) view that this is yet another case of Christians being influenced by non-Christian thought that they then shape up into Christian form and suppose to be sanctioned by God. The other is that, as Lewis puts it regarding another topic, these are "good dreams" that constitute a part of what God's sends as preparation for reception of Christian truth.

Walls wants to show that the doctrine of purgatory being considered is compatible with retention of personal identity from various metaphysical perspectives. Thus one sort of materialism (offered by Corcoran), Thomism (with two versions considered), and dualism (both the view that a person is a body-soul, two-substance being and the view that the person is the immaterial mind), are considered. Each is held to be compatible with purgatorial doctrine as Walls conceives it.

It is obviously important that an account of purgatory offer clear grounds for thinking that, if purgatory there be, personal identity will be retained in it. The emphasis in the Purgatory discussion is on recognition of personal identity -- on the inhabitant of purgatory being able to see himself as the same person as a particular pre-mortem person. One claim Walls considers, and with which he has considerable sympathy, is that were someone to be instantly "zapped" into moral perfection, she would not recognize herself as herself, whereas if moral perfection were reached over the course of a process in which she participated self-recognition would be no problem.

This is a splendid treatment of the topic -- as careful and fair a discussion of the doctrine of purgatory as one is likely to find.