The Logical Must: Wittgenstein on Logic

Placeholder book cover

Penelope Maddy, The Logical Must: Wittgenstein on Logic, Oxford University Press, 2014, 135pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199391752.

Reviewed by Martin Gustafsson, Åbo Akademi University


Penelope Maddy says in the introduction that her primary aim is "simply historical -- to understand Wittgenstein better" (3). As she immediately goes on to note, however, her method for reaching such understanding is unusual. Instead of treating Wittgenstein on his own terms, and as someone who, in Bernard Williams' words, could "help us in reviving a sense of strangeness or questionability about our own philosophical assumptions" (Willliams 2006, 260), Maddy tries as best she can to make Wittgenstein's views fit her own, naturalist and empiricist conception of logic -- a conception she calls "Second Philosophy" (developed in Maddy 2007). She freely admits that this exercise involves playing down the significance of, or even ignoring, elements in Wittgenstein's thought that he himself took to be of central importance. Her claim, however, is that those elements are obsolete, and that the naturalistic transformation she proposes brings out the substantive and still profitable core of Wittgenstein's philosophy of logic.

Naturally, this sort of method runs a great risk of deteriorating into a mere projection of the interpreter's own favorite views onto the texts she claims to be interpreting. Maddy suggests that arguing for her own naturalism is only a secondary aim of the book, to be achieved "Along the way" (3). As I hope will become clear, however, there are reasons to believe that this is in fact her basic motivation.

The book divides into three parts. First, Maddy traces what she takes to be the Kantian roots of her conception, proposing a naturalization of Kant's view of logic. Second, she discusses the Tractatus, arguing similarly that Wittgenstein's early conception of logic can be transformed along naturalistic lines so that it approaches the Second Philosopher's position. Third, she explores Wittgenstein's later philosophy, repeating the same pattern of argument: even if he does not want to admit it, the author of Philosophical Investigations and Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics is most charitably read as a Second Philosopher in (unwitting) disguise.

Maddy's treatment of Kant is a sort of preamble, and is a condensed version of chapters I.4 and III.2 in Maddy 2007. I will only say a few words about it here. Maddy starts from what she claims to be a central and attractive feature of Kant's and Wittgenstein's positions alike, namely, the idea that "the validity of logical laws arises from the structure of our own physical world" (49). A reader of the Critique of Pure Reason and The Jäsche Logic may find the ascription of this view to their author puzzling, for at least two reasons. First, the distinction between general and transcendental logic, which is crucial to Kant, is all but neglected in Maddy's discussion (she mentions it in a footnote on p. 9). Second, whatever Kant may exactly think about the nature of logic, it seems that the view that he is most concerned to combat is precisely the idea that the validity of logic arises from the structure of physical reality. Now, Maddy is aware that Kant himself would say that his Copernican revolution implies that the order of dependence is rather the reverse, and that a proper view of the relation between logic and the world is possible only from a transcendental (rather than empirical) point of view. Her proposal, however, is that a fruitfully naturalistic appropriation of Kant must reject this aspect of his conception, by taking the "two-level, transcendental/empirical position and collaps[e] it down to one empirical level" (35). "I don't pretend that the position generated by so radical an adjustment remains close enough to Kant to qualify as 'neo-Kantian'", she admits in a footnote (19, n. 11). I think it needs to be said, more strongly, that the proposed adjustment entails a view that is downright and unreservedly anti-Kantian.

With regard to Maddy's treatment of Wittgenstein (early and late), I have analogous worries, and here I want to look at her discussion in a bit more detail. Starting with the Tractatus, she is quite clear that the book's author does not advocate but sets himself against a naturalist conception of logic. Still, she suggests that this anti-naturalist stance is only a "particular thread" the removal of which "removes the need for mystery" while early Wittgenstein's "central inspiration is left unaffected" (56). She takes this "central inspiration" to be the notion of meaning as a matter of picturing, and she claims that this notion can survive and even be more plausibly construed once Wittgenstein's aprioristic conception of what picturing requires in terms of the priority of sense and the possibility of a complete analysis down to simples are abandoned.

I do not want to argue against the claim that early Wittgenstein gives an overblown account of the conditions of picturing. Rather, what I find puzzling about Maddy's reading is that she just ignores the most direct and obviously relevant reason why Wittgenstein opposes any view according to which the validity of logical laws arises from something external to logic itself, be it "the structure of our own physical world" or anything else. What I have in mind is the notorious logocentric predicament: logic cannot be justified, since any attempt at such justification will already have to presuppose logic. As Wittgenstein was fond of putting it, "Logic must look after itself" (Wittgenstein 1963, 5.473). This is the main theme of Thomas Ricketts's classic 1985 paper, "Frege, the Tractatus, and the Logocentric Predicament", and many of the most profoundly illuminating works on the Tractatus written since then place this issue at the very core of Wittgenstein's project. Such interpretations convincingly cast doubt on the idea that Wittgenstein thought it made any sense at all to ask what makes the laws of logic "valid". Maddy, however, relies almost exclusively on David Pears' metaphysical reading, which is arguably much less mainstream nowadays than she suggests (37). Ricketts's work isn't referred to at all, nor is Hidé Ishiguro's, Michael Kremer's or Peter Sullivan's, just to name a few of the most important writers who go unmentioned.

The central naturalizing move Maddy proposes with regard to the Tractatus is an abandonment of the idea of the priority of sense -- that is, of the idea that the sense of a proposition must be possible to fully identify before the question of its truth-value can be meaningfully addressed. Her treatment of what such an abandonment would mean within the Tractarian system remains superficial precisely because she in no way relates it to Wittgenstein's attempt to offer a satisfactory treatment of the logocentric predicament. Her discussion thus leaves it fundamentally unclear how rejecting the priority of sense could lead to a naturalized and yet still recognizably Tractarian conception according to which logic is not "fundamentally different from other descriptions of the world, just more general" (x). After all, at the very heart of early Wittgenstein's conception of logic lies the idea that "All theories that make a proposition of logic appear to have content are false" and that if a logical proposition is understood as similar in character to a proposition of natural science "this is the sure sign that it has been construed wrongly" (Wittgenstein 1963, 6.111). As in her treatment of Kant, what Maddy takes to be a charitable adjustment of the Tractarian view in effect amounts to a profoundly anti-Tractarian conception.

According to Maddy, later Wittgenstein differs from his early self in that he abandons the notion of the priority of sense. This, she suggests, will be appreciated by "Even the most casual reader" of the Philosophical Investigations and the Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics (63). She argues that such abandonment is the upshot of Wittgenstein's discussions of rule-following. Now, we saw her argue that what stood in the way of naturalism in the Tractatus was precisely a commitment to the priority of sense. Thus, it is understandable that she has difficulties understanding why later Wittgenstein, while unequivocally abandoning precisely this presumption, nonetheless continues to resist a naturalization along the lines of Second Philosophy. Maddy, however, argues that this non-naturalist attitude is based on a mere idiosyncrasy on Wittgenstein's part, namely, his "personal antipathy to science" which "by itself carries no force" (122). She claims that someone who does not share Wittgenstein's "anti-scientific presumption" (125) will see more clearly than Wittgenstein himself that his later philosophy is in fact a variety of Second Philosophy.

But is it really true that Wittgenstein abandoned the notion of the priority of sense in the sort of straightforward way suggested by Maddy? Consider the following passage from the Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, quoted by Maddy on p. 93:

the reason why [the steps in a logical inference] are not brought into question is not that they 'certainly correspond to the truth' -- or something of the sort, -- no, it is just this that is called 'thinking', 'speaking', 'inferring', 'arguing'. There is not any question at all here of some correspondence between what is said and reality; rather is logic antecedent to any such correspondence; in the same sense, that is, as that in which the establishment of a method of measurement is antecedent to the correctness or incorrectness of a statement of length. (Wittgenstein 1978, I, §156)

Understandably, this passage gives Maddy trouble. She ends up dismissing it as the expression of an idea that "Wittgenstein was continually tempted by" but which he in fact rejected (95). It seems to me much more plausible, however, that what is indicated by this and similar passages in Wittgenstein's later works is that his treatment of the relations between sense and truth, between a method of measurement and its application, and between logical and empirical propositions, is much more complicated and subtle than Maddy can afford to admit. In his discussions of rule-following, Wittgenstein is not in any straightforward sense rejecting but is rather trying to make clear sense of the notion of antecedence that figures in the just quoted passage. His claim is not that a rule such as "add 2" does not determine that "1002" follows "1000" prior to the actual performance of that particular calculation -- for how could the rule then be a rule, a standard, at all? Rather, the difficulty is to understand how such antecedent determination is possible without making an incoherent mystery of it. Maddy never gets this difficulty into clear focus.

Think of Wittgenstein's treatment of intentional concepts like "wanting" and "striving towards", and of his criticism of Russell's attempt to naturalize such concepts. Wittgenstein famously ridiculed Russell's conception, according to which only subsequent events will determine what I actually want: its upshot would be that if I want an apple, and someone gives me a punch in the stomach so that my appetite goes away, then it was the punch that I originally wanted. It remains unclear why Maddy's reading of Wittgenstein on meaning and logic is not basically Russellian in this sense, and she does not seem to understand the problems Wittgenstein saw with that sort of conception.

It is of course true that Wittgenstein himself came to emphasize the dependency of meaning and logic on real-life human practices, on how we spontaneously react to concrete learning procedures, and on general features of our world. But again, it is a central and very difficult question exactly how this notion of "dependence" is to be understood. One thing seems clear, however: Wittgenstein was always careful to distinguish the relevant notion of dependence from the notions of justification and verification, as these latter notions function in the sciences. He never claims that the validity of a logical law "depends on" general features of the world and our practices in the same sort of way as the truth of an empirical statement "depends on" how things are. Maddy, by contrast, constantly tends to fuse these different notions of dependence, which is why she can claim that we "find Wittgenstein and the Second Philosopher arguing side by side on the contingency of logical truth, neither showing much sympathy for efforts to see logic as somehow special" (125).

Judged in terms of the "historical" work it claims to be, Maddy's book falls well below established standards. She tendentiously projects her own views onto Wittgenstein's texts, and fails to take the best recent scholarship into due consideration. It is true, of course, that an engagement with the writings of an important philosopher can have great value even if it does not live up to such standards of historical scholarship (Kripke's book on Wittgenstein is a case in point). My greatest dissatisfaction with Maddy's book, however, is that she misses the real adventure in Wittgenstein's philosophy. The deepest and most intriguing aspects of his inquiries are made invisible in her discussion, and his philosophy of logic therefore ends up looking much more superficial and irrelevant than it actually is.


Maddy, Penelope. 2007. Second Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Ricketts, Thomas. 1985. Frege, the Tractatus, and the Logocentric Predicament. Noûs 19: 3-15.

Williams, Bernard. 2006. Descartes and the Historiography of Philosophy. In his The Sense of the Past, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 257-64.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1961. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1978. Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics, rev. ed. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.