The Logical Structure of Kinds

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Eric Funkhouser, The Logical Structure of Kinds, Oxford University Press, 2014, 182pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713302.

Reviewed by Alexander Bird, University of Bristol


Although its title might suggest that this book is primarily about kinds, its focus is really on two species of relation between kinds and properties: determination (the relationship between determinable and determinate) and realization. Its central idea is that determination and realization are distinct and incompatible. According to Eric Funkhouser's theory a kind has, necessarily, certain determination dimensions. These are the dimensions (respects, quantities) in which specific properties that are the determinates of the determinable kind can differ. So two different sounds are both determinates of the determinable kind sound because they both have specific values along dimensions characteristic of sound such as pitch, volume, timbre. Realization is not like this, however. For realizers are not more specific versions of what they realize; that is, they are not specific along the determination dimensions of the kind. For example, consider the kind pain. One determination dimension for pain is intensity. So different pain properties may differ by having different intensities. Let us accept that pain is multiply realized so that human pain is realized by neural activity of neurological type A whereas Martian pain is multiply realized by neural activity of type B. However, the determination dimensions of neural activity do not include intensity but will include other dimensions (that one would have to articulate in the language of neuroscience) that are not dimensions of pain.

Funkhouser articulates his theory in detail for the first half or more of his book. It is in the latter part that matters come alive when he uses the theory to spell out differences with those who have different views and criticisms of positions depending on assumptions inconsistent with his account. For example, he directly takes on those, such as Stephen Yablo and Sydney Shoemaker, who explicitly regard realization as a species of determination, and others, such as Ruth Millikan and Lawrence Shapiro, who are also committed to this. The view in question holds, to quote Yablo, 'mental properties stand to their physical realizations in the relation that rectangularity bears to squareness, or that colors bear to their shades' ("Mental Causation" Philosophical Review 101(2), 1992: 256). Shapiro provides the example of corkscrew, which he says is multiply realized by the different types of corkscrew mechanism (e.g. the waiter's corkscrew and the winged corkscrew). Funkhouser argues that according to his theory these are different determinates of the determinable corkscrew. But they are not different realizations of corkscrew. This is because a difference in determinate kind necessarily makes a difference regarding the determinable kind but a difference in realizer does not necessarily make a difference regarding the realized kind. For example, a difference in shade is a necessarily difference in color. But if A and B are differences in the realizers of pain (e.g. they are the realizers of human pain and of Martian pain) then that difference is not necessarily a difference in 'pain-ness' (to use Funkhouser's expression). Funkhouser argues that Shapiro's different corkscrew mechanisms are necessarily differences in corkscrew-ness -- if there were a science of corkscrews it would have to mark such a difference -- and so the different mechanisms are different determinates of the corkscrew kind.

In Funkhouser's view it is for science to decide what the determination dimensions of a kind are. This seems right, the hue, saturation, and intensity dimensions of color are not apriori. But it would be good to know more about what such a scientific decision would be based upon. Why should not a science of pain decide that the mechanisms of the various realizations of pain (if it is multiply realized -- see below) are to be regarded are determination dimensions of pain? I suspect that Funkhouser's notion of pain-ness here is a purely phenomenological notion and that it is apriori for him that differences in realizer are not relevant to a science of phenomenological pain. I am not sure why we should accept this. Must there be a science of phenomenological pain distinct from the science of pain that takes an interest in the mechanisms of pain (which is true of actual pain research)? It strikes me as entirely plausible, if pain were multiply realized, that there could be a single science of pain that takes the different realizers to be different kinds of pain just as the different corkscrew mechanisms make for different kinds of corkscrew. The phenomenological indistinguishability of the different kinds of pain is no more an objection than the functional indistinguishability of the different kinds of corkscrew (if you think that the different ways you have to use the two mechanisms of corkscrew is itself a difference in function, then just imagine electric-powered versions of each, such that in both the user just presses a button).

Funkhouser then confronts Jaegwon Kim's argument against multiple realizability, a conclusion reached for similar reasons by Millikan and Richard Boyd. That argument asks why we should expect a multiply realized kind, where the realizers are wildly heterogeneous, to obey any interesting laws (or provide informative explanations, etc.). Funkhouser's response to Kim et al. is to point out that, as his theory says, the determination dimensions for the kind (e.g. pain) are different from those for the realizers. I'm not entirely sure how that is supposed to answer Kim's worry, though it is worth noting that Funkhouser argues for the ontological, explanatory, and methodological autonomy of the kinds from their realizers. And he does also express his own skepticism regarding philosophers arguing on apriori grounds that some apparent scientific possibility is in fact impossible. Still, I am not sure what the argument against Kim is. This is the point at which a little discussion of some real science would help a great deal. Are there any really good examples of a non-trivial science whose kinds are multiply and heterogeneously realized? The nearest we get is a quote from Jerry Fodor:

The very existence of the special sciences testifies to reliable macrolevel regularities that are realized by mechanisms whose physical substance is quite typically heterogeneous. Does anybody really doubt that mountains are made of all sorts of stuff? Does anybody really think that, since they are, generalizations about mountains-as-such won't continue to serve geology in good stead? ("Special Sciences: Still Autonomous After All These Years" Philosophical Perspectives 11, 1997: 160).

But Fodor's comment doesn't get us very far at all. After all, mountains are not made of 'all sorts of stuff' -- they are all made of rock; there are not mountains made of living organic material, there are not mountains made of ice (West Virginia's 'Ice Mountain' is not a mountain and isn't made of ice), and so on. So the realizations of the kind mountain are not at all 'wildly heterogeneous'. Furthermore there are few interesting generalizations in geology about mountains-as-such, and some of these really belong to meteorology (and there would be even fewer if we did accept that there could be organic mountains and ice mountains). For informative generalizations and explanations involving mountains we need to distinguish different types of mountain, and at this point their constitution (i.e. the nature of the realizers of mountain) does become significant. For example, volcanoes are a key sub-type of mountain, and these are mountains formed in a certain way and are constituted by a particular type of rock. So it may be that on closer inspection Fodor's example in fact undermines his case (and Funkhouser's) and strengthens Kim's.

I would have welcomed more detailed consideration of cases such as this -- for my taste the discussion sometimes remained too general and abstract. The two examples that do recur are pain (for multiple realizability) and color (for determination). Following the tradition, there is mention of human pain, reptile pain, and Martian pain, for each of which, by assumption (as above), there are different realizers. As it happens, the mechanisms of human and reptile pain are much the same (though less developed in reptiles) -- both are realized through nociceptors. Funkhouser does discuss memory as a case study, which is both interesting and helpful. On the other hand, he takes care to point out that his discussion is consistent with Kim's skepticism, so we still lack a clear, convincing, and detailed example of multiple realizability. (Vision might have been a better case for Funkhouser's purposes because this does really seem to be multiply realized, at least at first sight.)

This book covers numerous interesting and important topics, such as the species (ontological, explanatory, and methodological) of and degrees of autonomy that a kind has from its realizers, singular realizability and the identity of kinds, and properties (tropes) and their individuation, among others. Those concerned with multiple realizability will certainly benefit from studying it, as will others with interests in metaphysics and philosophy of mind.