The Lost Age of Reason: Philosophy in Early Modern India 1450-1700

Placeholder book cover

Jonardon Ganeri, The Lost Age of Reason: Philosophy in Early Modern India 1450-1700, Oxford University Press, 2011, 284pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199218745.

Reviewed by Thom Brooks, Durham University


Jonardon Ganeri's book is a treasure trove of new insights and fascinating figures that leaves this reader craving much more. He weaves a rich tapestry where ideas come to life, reinvigorating our understanding of Indian philosophy and the important lessons it can teach us today.

The book is refreshing and exciting for several reasons. First, it focuses on a less familiar historical period. Indian philosophy has too often been presented as nothing more than classical Indian philosophy, implying that Indian thought has failed to make much progress beyond the giant steps of its founding figures. Ganeri brings alive the leading figures of early modern India from Gangesa and Vidyanivasa to Yasovijaya Gani and Mahadeva, alongside the refreshing insights into "new reason" philosophy, logic and philosophy of language, and the nature of the self.

Second the book is an excellent scholarly historical study that is more than merely historical. Ganeri combines the expert rigor of the philosophical explorer in search of new discoveries that improve upon past analyses of these movements and figures with a clear focus on what is of most philosophical interest. Those hoping to benefit from rich historical exploration will not be disappointed; nor, more importantly, will those looking to learn something more about the philosophical issues at hand, such as new insights into reason, metaphysics, and the self.

Finally, Ganeri has succeeded at producing a brilliant work of Indian philosophy that is also something much more. Philosophical work in the West is notoriously resistant to engagement with other philosophical traditions. This is much less true of work in non-Western traditions, where some engagement is often present although sometimes the connection is not deeply explored or too superficial. Ganeri is as knowledgeable of and at home with one tradition as he is with the other: the perfect guide for those coming to early modern Indian philosophy for the first time or those returning to the subject again. Anyone interested in learning about early modern Indian philosophy will have the best work I know of on the subject in their hands. And those interested more in the philosophical issues than in comparing traditions will also profit greatly. Perhaps what I enjoyed most on this score was that this was not a work in comparative philosophy (which too often is mired in superficialities), but a work of philosophy that offers contributions both historical and contemporary.

Ganeri provides a brief chronology and list of key individuals discussed as well as recommended readings for each chapter. There are sixteen chapters in total, presented across five parts. The first part focuses on "India Expanding" (chapters 1-4) and the growing cosmopolitanism of 15th Century Indian society. The second concerns "Text and Method" (chapters 5-8) and explores innovations in philosophy of language, such as the "new reason" school of philosophy's approach to commentary as weaved text. The third part, "The Possibility of Inquiry" (chapters 9-11), examines a critical period and includes a focus on Gangesa's Garland of Principles. The fourth part is "The Real World" (chapters 12-14), focusing on a new approach to understanding metaphysics. In part five, "A New Language of Philosophy" (chapters 15-16), Ganeri considers rival logics and a new philosophy of language. This review lacks the space to do justice to the intricately detailed argumentative narrative on offer, but I will focus briefly on one area that illuminates some of the impressive features highlighted above.

In chapter 8, Ganeri discusses the fascinating use of commentary across different levels to communicate philosophical ideas. Starting from the brief formulaic assertions aggregated in the sutra, he identifies several layers. First, there is the commentary aiming to unpack the sutra (or bhasya) and then the subcommentary defending particular constructions of the sutra over alternatives.  Beyond these there is nibandha and other meta-level "commentarial activity" that "continue the process of revision and adjustment until a state of reflective equilibrium is reached" (103). Indian philosophical discourse operates with multiple textures providing a richly intricate tapestry of illuminating insights, as well as presenting a certain complexity for clear exegesis. A recurring theme of the book is that Indian philosophy lacks a Western conception of modernity, where the modern represents a break from and rejection of the past. Instead, Indian philosophers view the past as something to engage and develop further in a rich multitude of ways. The past continually informs our present through rigorous scrutiny and revision across different levels of philosophical analysis. We might understand this in the following way: "reading philosophically is a way of thinking philosophically" (115). Commentaries provide more than an exegesis; they represent a creative act, "a rejuvenation of the ancient in the present" (115).

Ronald Dworkin argued that legal interpretation might be understood within the context of writing a chain novel: we work within parameters given to us through the legislative history and existing precedents to fashion a new chapter. Our task is to offer a compelling narrative within the overall narrative already present. Indian philosophy proposes a perhaps more complex task where our new chapters do not merely add, but aim to reconstruct our interpretation of the whole. Indian philosophers create and revise structures of meaning that help provide thematic coherence to the sutra through commentarial activity. Philosophical texts are, to some degree, interconnected at different levels and in different directions. Such a methodology is not unknown in the Western tradition, but it is more deeply embedded in the Indian tradition.

For an illustration, consider the following statements presented in chapter 9. We begin with the original comment by Sabara:

It must either be commonly known (prasiddha) what moral duty is, or else not commonly known. If it is commonly known, then there will be no inquiry. If, however, it is not commonly known, then all the more none. So this work of inquiry into moral duty is quite pointless (120).

This paradox about our ability to know things such as our moral duties is reformulated by Kumarila Bhatta:

It is possible to know that which is commonly known, but being commonly known there is no desire [to know it]. On the other hand, that which is not commonly known, being impossible [to know], is all the more not [a possible object of a desire to know] (120).

Samkara then develops these ideas further:

It must, however, either be commonly known what brahman is, or else not commonly known. If it is commonly known, then there shall be no 'desire to know'; but if not commonly known, then it is impossible to inquire [into it] (121).

One philosopher engages and revises ideas from the past to different ends (as well as demonstrating a clear interest in distinctions now made famous by Donald Rumsfeld concerning "known unknowns," "unknown knows" and "unknown unknowns" centuries beforehand). This is about more than working within a tradition; it is about reworking the tradition at different levels of philosophical analysis. Furthermore, our goal is not merely gaining greater clarity about our knowledge of objects and virtues: the truth has importance as a means of liberation -- the truth, literally, sets us free.

It is customary to register some criticism in reviews. My only wish was that the discussion was even wider to include a greater exploration of developments since the early modern period -- but perhaps this is best left for a second volume. Ganeri's book is a fascinating view of Indian philosophy and how its insights have genuine relevance for contemporary debates. I could not recommend it more highly.