The Luck of the Draw: The Role of Lotteries in Decision Making

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Peter Stone, The Luck of the Draw: The Role of Lotteries in Decision Making, Oxford University Press, 2011, 195pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199756100

Reviewed by Shlomi Segall, The Hebrew University of Jerusalem


When is it appropriate to employ lotteries? Peter Stone offers a clear answer: when it is essential to prevent bad reasons from affecting decisions about allocation. This sanitizing effect, as Stone aptly terms it, distinguishes lotteries as a proper method of decision making. Lotteries might, of course, have the adverse effect of also keeping out good reasons (think of democracy by lot). Stone gives us a useful formula for tackling this: lotteries are a proper decision-making method when the bad reasons they prevent outweigh the good ones they keep out.

The Luck of the Draw is a modest book (in volume, among other things), with a modest ambition. Stone establishes his thesis with careful and incremental steps, and is cautious not to venture too far beyond that. The modesty is commendable, but it may also leave some readers frustrated. This might be true especially for those who seek in this book a thorough treatment of the relation between lotteries and distributive justice. One may speculate that not a few readers will be precisely so inclined, given the growing interest in the cross-section between justice and luck. This is owed of course to the emergence of luck egalitarianism as an alternative conception of justice to the to-date dominant Rawlsian approach. These readers will gain important insights from Stone, but perhaps not as many as they would have hoped for.

I should say that despite being relatively short, the book actually takes a while to get to the heart of its argument. It begins by covering a lot of familiar ground, at times making rather heavy weather over pretty obvious characteristics of lotteries. The monograph takes off, really, only when justice is introduced into the scene. (This happens late in chapter 3, more than a third into the book). But once this happens, the book makes for very an interesting and valuable read.

Still, the thesis is not without difficulties. Stone provides three criteria for the assessment of the justice of allocations by lottery. He calls these the equality, priority, and efficiency conditions. Equality is the straightforward requirement that like cases be treated alike. Priority refers to the condition that when it is impossible to satisfy all claims, they must be satisfied in the order of their strength (e.g., how needy a patient is). The efficiency condition is the familiar Pareto requirement of giving to Peter when this does not rob Paul. This is all very plausible as a set of policy guidelines. But crucially, it is less convincing as a theory of justice in lotteries. Most non-Rawlsians will be unmoved by the curious inclusion of considerations of efficiency within an assessment of justice. Pareto efficiency is no doubt a weighty moral consideration but not everyone agrees that it should inform our conception of justice. Stone does not do much to substantiate this, nor does he recognize his need to do so.

This unsubstantiated move is no trifle matter, and has considerable implications later on. These put Stone at odds with other serious studies of the justice of lotteries. John Broome, for example, famously showed that lotteries, while fair in themselves, leave some unfairness in their wake. After all, of two equally deserving patients, only one will end up getting the kidney (say). There is an outcome-inequality here, and it is attributable to nothing but luck. The outcome is justified but it is not just, many would agree upon reflection. Stone's inclusion of a third requirement of efficiency allows him to side-step this. It is inefficient, and hence unjust, to let the kidney go to waste. Egalitarians will not be too convinced by this rather quick move. States of affairs can be good for reasons of efficiency and bad for reasons of fairness, and vice versa. We must be careful not to confuse the two. There is also no need to conflate distributive justice with rights (see p. 87). Letting the kidney go to waste is foolish and wrong, but it is not necessarily a failure of anyone's rights. (At least not without some much more substantial argumentation than the one offered by Stone here). And it is equally false that 'there is no moral advantage to such an action' (that is, to the Solomonic judgement of giving the kidney to no one). There is a moral advantage to such an action. It's called equality. It may not (indeed, it should not) be an overriding consideration, but it is a consideration nevertheless.

It is a little unfortunate, then, that while the book contains a sophisticated and nuanced account of lotteries, its handling of justice is less so. Stone, I think, is on much firmer ground when discussing Broome's claim about lotteries as satisfying some surrogate good. He builds here on David Wasserman's excellent work to dismiss Broome's thesis that lotteries distribute something of value beyond the good to be allocated (e.g., the kidney). The idea, Stone nicely shows, is simply incoherent. If the 'surrogate good' of chances is somehow seen by Broome as compensating the loss of the other good, namely the kidney, then it would follow, among other things, that losers must be given a greater share of that first good, namely the chances. But that is incoherent. There is no way of giving some people the good in question, while giving others a greater chance to receive the good.

What, then, is the proper relation between justice and lotteries? In his own positive account (p. 83), Stone seems to run together both the negative requirement of ensuring 'that the agent does not deploy any reason for favouring one strongest claimant over another' (let's call this the prevention of prejudice or partiality), with the positive requirement of 'employing a process that selects each one with equal probability' (let's call this equal chances). But as Matt Cavanagh (whom Stone curiously does not cite) has already shown, these two requirements may come apart. (Admittedly, some philosophers have come to dispute that.) And we must therefore decide which of them is the one truly accounting for the justice of lotteries (for Cavanagh it is distinctly the former, namely the prevention of prejudice or partiality).

To anyone interested primarily in justice (which admittedly not all of Stone's readers might be), lotteries present a fascinating dilemma. They are a fair procedure that nevertheless results in an inevitable unfairness. In his treatment of at least this issue, I am not sure that Stone brings us closer to solving this puzzle. Here, then, is one possible key for unlocking this dilemma and it would be interesting to know what Stone would make of it. One might say that while lotteries are (no doubt) the proper way to allocate indivisible goods (such as kidneys), they nevertheless result in unfairness, since the loser in the draw has suffered bad brute luck. And crucially, it is a case of brute (rather than option) luck because it would have been unreasonable to expect the agent (the patient in this case) to refrain from entering the draw. Conducting a lottery is thus justified while nevertheless leading to an injustice. It generates a brute luck disadvantage.

The Luck of the Draw is a rewarding read. (Among its many clear virtues, its dry sense of humour left me laughing out loud on more than one occasion.) Peter Stone should be commended for giving us this crisp, elegant, and intelligent book. It constitutes a valuable addition to the growing literature on luck and justice.


Broome, John, 1984. "Selecting People Randomly." Ethics, 95, 38-55.

Broome, John, 1984. "Uncertainty and Fairness." The Economic Journal, 94, 624-632.

Broome, John, 1990. "Fairness." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 91, 87-101.

Cavanagh, Matt. 2002. Against Equality of Opportunity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wasserman, David, 1996. "Let Them Eat Chances: Probability and Distributive Justice." Economics and Philosophy, 12, 29-49.