The Lure of Whitehead

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Nicholas Gaskill and A. J. Nocek (eds.), The Lure of Whitehead, University of Minnesota Press, 2014, 427pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816679966.

Reviewed by Brian G. Henning, Gonzaga University


For three-quarters of a century the work of the mathematician and philosopher Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947) has languished, ignored equally by mainstream Continental and Anglo-American thinkers. The reasons for this are complex, but, to grossly simplify, one might say that Whitehead's was a project born in the wrong season.[1] Of course, as he himself famously noted, "Philosophy never reverts to its old position after the shock of a great philosopher."[2] Whitehead's philosophy of organism did not die, though its growth was certainly stunted and many potentially verdant branches withered. After this long period of neglect, Whitehead's philosophy of organism is experiencing a rather dramatic rebirth. From the creation of centers for process thought in China[3] and Europe,[4] to the start of a new book series Contemporary Whitehead Studies and Edinburgh University Press's launch of a critical edition, Whitehead's thought is once again provoking intense interest.[5] Building on the energy created by the English translation of Isabelle Stengers' Thinking with Whitehead: A Free and Wild Creation of Ideas,[6] Nicholas Gaskill and A. J. Nocek capture, in their book, both the dynamism and breadth of the scholarly interest in Whitehead within contemporary Continental thought.

The Lure of Whitehead is a wonderful reminder of the continuing scholarly value of a thoughtfully edited collection. It is well known that adoption of a for-profit business model has radically transformed American academic publishing. Gone are the days when university presses subsidized important work with a small but vibrant audience. Nowhere has this bottom line mentality been more prevalent or damaging than with edited collections. This is an unfortunate development, and the University of Minnesota Press should be commended for recognizing the invaluable scholarly contributions provided by well-crafted and well-timed anthologies such as this. Gaskill and Nocek have done a great service for their reader by assembling and organizing essays on a host of issues central to contemporary thought, many by leading figures in their to fields, such as Isabelle Stengers, Bruno Latour, and Graham Harman. Collectively, these essays open a window onto the pivotal role of Whitehead in the struggle for the future of Continental thought.

As the editors include concise summaries of each of the fifteen chapters in their introduction, I will forgo the traditional summary here. But perhaps it is helpful to note the three primary divisions under which the essays are collected. The first section brings together essays that take up Whitehead's central task of overcoming the modern penchant to bifurcate reality. Each essay "adopts Whiteheadian concepts and technique as tools for transforming our modes of analysis, and each extends the speculative hope that the impasses of previous centuries might be transformed into novel contrasts" (25). The standout is an exceptional essay, "What is the Style of Matters of Concern?" by Latour, who suggests that rather than trying to "build a bridge" to join the bifurcated realms of the "social" and the "natural," the "mental" and the "physical," we should

go with the flow -- that is, to get involved in a bit of canoeing, kayaking, or rafting. . . . This flowing lateral direction, turned at a ninety-degree angle from the obsessive question of bridge-building is, if I am not mistaken, what William James called "pure experience." (96)

Latour demonstrates quite effectively that Whitehead provides a rich set of metaphysical resources for unthinking the bifurcation of nature.

The second grouping of essays is unified around "creativity," Whitehead's "Category of the Ultimate." Focusing primarily on the relationship between the work of Gilles Deleuze and Whitehead, these essays focus on the metaphysics of the new. Harman's "Whitehead and Schools X, Y, and Z," which I will discuss further shortly, is the star of this section. Finally, the last section, which is somewhat misleadingly titled "Process Ecology," brings together essays that explore the implications of Whitehead's "reformed subjectivism," the view that outside of the experience of subjects there is "nothing, nothing, nothing, bare nothingness."[7] Within this pansubjectivist framework, we are invited to consider the nature of nonanthropological subjectivity (chapters 11 and 12), the metaphysical basis and expanded scope of sociology (chapter 14), and the nature and locus of life in a processive cosmos (chapter 15).

The value of the volume is greatly enhanced by the editors' inclusion in the introduction of a masterful primer on Whitehead's thought. This embedded précis effectively demonstrates that the tired complaints over the difficulty of Whitehead's work are unjustified. With this clear introduction to Whitehead's thought, the volume becomes accessible to readers who are familiar with contemporary thought, but perhaps less familiar with Whitehead. As a result, it will be of great value to scholars interested in becoming acquainted with or staying abreast of the growing role of Whitehead's thought in key debates. In particular, anyone interested in the future of Continental philosophy will benefit from reading these essays.

By way of conclusion I would note that the revival of Whitehead embodied by The Lure of Whitehead differs from earlier attempts in at least two important ways. First, this volume is dramatically interdisciplinary, attempting to facilitate conversations across fields as diverse as philosophy, education, sociology, computer science, biology, aesthetics, and literary theory. Though this diversity does loosen the knit of the contributions, at times giving more breadth than depth, in the end this interdisciplinary diversity is more asset than liability, for it reveals that the value of Whitehead's thought is ultimately located not in its completeness but in its fecundity. Indeed, it is the fact that Whitehead is speaking to scholars in many different disciplines that in part explains the revitalization of Whitehead's work in contemporary thought.

Secondly, the revival of Whitehead scholarship captured by this volume also differs from earlier attempts in that it is primarily being driven by scholars deriving from Continental modes of thought. In particular, this volume captures what Keith Robinson calls "the Deleuzean inspired revival of Whitehead's extraordinary philosophy" (227). Harman sounds the sole note of dissension in the collection, contending that Deleuze scholars are illicitly colonizing Whitehead scholarship. Indeed, his goal is to "drive a wedge into the crack between two types of 'process' philosophers" (242): Whitehead (and Latour) on the one hand (what he calls School X) and Deleuze, Stengers, et alia on the other (School Y). Though Harman ultimately disagrees with the conflation of Whitehead and Deleuze, he nevertheless finds "Whitehead . . . compellingly ambiguous" with respect to his own object-oriented philosophy (232).

Though a relatively minor part of the overall volume, I focus on Harman's claims to give a sense of the degree to which Whitehead's thought is the context in which leading scholars are developing and contrasting their respective philosophical projects. Thus, as the editors note, their volume should be seen less as a "return" to Whitehead and more as "a way forward, a way through and around the impasses of contemporary thought" (2). In capturing these provocative and insightful essays struggling with the identity and future of contemporary thought, The Lure of Whitehead not only captures the state of the discussion, it makes meaningful contributions to it. In the end, then, the book isn't about Whitehead's views. It isn't a polemical work about philosophy. Its fifteen essays take inspiration from Whitehead to do philosophy, to participate in the ongoing adventure of ideas. My hope is that future projects will not only seek to bridge disciplinary boundaries through Whitehead's work, but also to bridge philosophical boundaries. Though entrenched and ossified, the distinction between Anglo-American and Continental thought is becoming less and less relevant to younger generations of thinkers. If Whitehead's work is as fertile as these essays suggest, perhaps it can serve as a raft or a kayak on which to flow between these false boundaries.

[1] For more on this see Gaskill and Nocek’s fifth footnote on page 33.

[2] (Process and Reality, 11).

[3] For more on the China Project.

[5] As evidence of this, note the activity of the Whitehead Research Project, which holds regular international academic conferences and sponsors the Contemporary Whitehead Studies series and the Edinburgh Critical Edition of the Complete Works of Alfred North Whitehead. (In the interest of disclosure, I am involved in many of these projects.)

[6] Isabelle Stengers, Thinking with Whitehead: A Free and Wild Creation of Ideas (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2014).

[7] Alfred North Whitehead, Process and Reality, corrected edition, edited by Donald Sherburne and David Ray Griffin (New York: Free Press, 1978), 167.