The Making of Friedrich Nietzsche: The Quest for Identity, 1844-1869

Placeholder book cover

Daniel Blue, The Making of Friedrich Nietzsche: The Quest for Identity, 1844-1869, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 344pp., $49.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107134867.

Reviewed by Matthew Meyer, The University of Scranton


Daniel Blue provides a substantive account of Nietzsche's early life that will be invaluable to Nietzsche scholars and of interest to the general reader. What makes Blue's biography remarkable is the scholarly rigor with which he undertakes the project. What makes Blue's biography unique is the way he weaves various autobiographical sketches that Nietzsche wrote between the ages of thirteen and twenty-four into his account. Taken together, Blue provides a well-researched narrative of Nietzsche's early life that highlights Nietzsche's attempts to direct his own development and understand the self through the act of writing.

Blue divides the book into an introduction, fourteen main chapters, and an afterword. It begins with an account of the family and environment into which Nietzsche was born and concludes with Nietzsche's departure from Naumburg for a professorship at the University of Basel at the tender age of twenty-four. The introduction stresses themes that run throughout the book: the external influences on Nietzsche's life and thought, Nietzsche's emerging quest to achieve Bildung or self-cultivation in the Humboldtian sense, and the six autobiographical sketches Nietzsche wrote during the period under investigation.

Blue claims that his account is meant to challenge the one provided by Nietzsche's sister, Elizabeth Förster-Nietzsche. Blue argues that Förster-Nietzsche's work, although filled with factual infelicities, has assumed the status of an Urbiographie because many biographers have simply repeated a number of claims she makes without examining their accuracy. In contrast to such accounts, Blue sets out "to seize control" of this narrative from Förster-Nietzsche and "to restore it to the custody of her brother, using his autobiographies for guidance" (8).

Blue begins with an account of Nietzsche's immediate ancestors. He explains how his father, Carl Ludwig Nietzsche, met his mother, Franziska Oehler, and how the family came to settle in the village of Röcken just southwest of Leipzig where Nietzsche was born on October 15, 1844. As Blue explains in the first chapter, one of the most significant details of Nietzsche's early life was the loss of his father in July of 1849. Nietzsche's younger brother died only a few months later.

Chapters two through four narrate the family's subsequent move to the nearby town of Naumburg, where Nietzsche eventually enrolled in the prestigious boarding school of Schulpforta at the age of 13. Chapters five through eight give an in-depth account of Nietzsche's life as a student at Schulpforta that includes details about his friendships with fellow students like Paul Deussen, the potential influence of the poet, alcoholic, and Pforta alum Ernst Ortlepp, and his early interest in authors such as Jean Paul, Laurence Sterne, Lord Byron, and Ralph Waldo Emerson. The final six chapters detail Nietzsche's time as a university student at Bonn, then Leipzig, and finally his transition to Basel.

Woven throughout Blue's account is the significance and meaning of Bildung for both the young Nietzsche and nineteenth-century German culture. Blue provides a general account of Bildung in the second chapter as he gives the reader a sense of the social class into which Nietzsche was born (43-45), and this lays the foundation for his subsequent discussion of Nietzsche's first attempts at poetry in 1855, musical composition in 1857, and his first autobiography, "From My Life," in 1858. The latter is central to Blue's account, and he argues that key elements from Nietzsche's first autobiographical sketch can be linked to the notion of Bildung as self-cultivation or formation (91). Indeed, Blue notes the way in which Bildung formed the basis for a Humboldtian morality of developing oneself (102) that Nietzsche, both young and old, would ultimately take to heart.

Blue goes into great detail to show how Nietzsche both imbibed and modified the spirit of Humboldtian Bildung at Schulpforta. According to Blue, Nietzsche's discovery of Emerson in 1861-62 had him reading an author that agreed with the Humboldtian ideal but diverged from it in two important respects. First, Emerson placed a greater stress on the development of the individual as individual rather than, as Humboldt would have it, the capacities of the individual. Second, Emerson put an anti-social and anti-authoritarian spin on individual development. Rather than integrating with society, as Humboldt would have it, Emerson "tended rather to emphasize the individual as opposed to society" (137). In this sense, Nietzsche began to pursue a concept of Bildung that diverged from the Humboldtian program in slight yet significant ways, and although Blue avoids such speculation, one cannot help but think of how this might have influenced Nietzsche's more mature writings.

One of the most fascinating features of Blue's biography is the way he shows how Nietzsche's early life revealed a hidden tension within Humboldt's conception of Bildung. This comes to the fore as Blue's account moves from Nietzsche's time at Schulpforta to his days as a university student. According to Blue, the Humboldtian program assumed a convergence between Wissenschaft or scholarship (science) and Bildung or education in the sense of formation (258). Nietzsche's eventual education in classical philology under the tutelage of Friedrich Ritschl at Bonn and then Leipzig showed the difficulty of holding these two strands together. Whereas the initial impetus for studying the classics was rooted in the idea that classical authors were venerated exemplars of culture and self-cultivation (257), Ritschl took a more scholarly approach to philology and downplayed the humanistic and potentially formative aspects of the discipline. According to Blue, the problem this move toward Wissenschaft created was that "knowledge was no longer expected to serve the student." Instead, "the student was expected to serve knowledge" without any personal relationship to the subject matter (259), and the "sacrifice of the student's personhood on the altar of knowledge" was something the young Nietzsche "refused to endorse" (277).

Despite his reservations about Wissenschaft, Nietzsche quickly flourished as a philologist under Ritschl, and he worked diligently on figures such as Theognis and Democritus. Perhaps the most interesting of Nietzsche's scholarly projects was his study of Diogenes Laertius' Lives of the Philosophers. On the one hand, it was a way for Nietzsche to study not only philosophy under the guise of philology (264), but also the lives of philosophers and so how they cultivated themselves as unique individuals. Second, Blue discusses the fact that Nietzsche added the Greek epigraph, "Genoi' hoios essi" or "become who you are," to the version of the Diogenes paper that won a university prize in October,1867 (274). Although Blue wonders why Nietzsche would append such an epigraph to a work on Diogenes, "a man who in Nietzsche's view certainly did not become 'himself' at all but plagiarized wholesale from the books of others" (275), Nietzsche could have meant it -- and I am offering my own speculations here -- as a call to follow the paths of the ancient philosophers Diogenes treats in his works. In this sense, Nietzsche's commitment to Bildung and the Humboldtian call to "develop yourself" finds itself atop a piece of Wissenschaft that would eventually help land Nietzsche a professorship in Basel at the young age of twenty-four.

The final chapter of Blue's biography is largely dedicated to this remarkable feature of Nietzsche's academic career. Here, Blue explains in some detail the way in which Nietzsche's elevation to professor at Basel was clearly out of the norm. Nietzsche was essentially given the position on the basis of the scholarly work he had completed up to that time as well as Ritschl's willingness to stake his career on Nietzsche's hire turning out well (303). Indeed, Nietzsche did not even possess a doctorate when he was being considered for the position, and Ritschl had to help him rush through the formalities of the degree before taking the appointment.

At the same time, Blue explains that although family and friends were delighted with his career opportunity, Nietzsche regarded it "as the performance of a melancholy duty, which may have happy consequences for others, but not for him" (312). Blue speculates that Nietzsche's attitude might have been due to his nostalgia for the past. However, it may be -- and again I am only speculating -- that Nietzsche simply felt the tension between his new duties in the field of Wissenschaft and a deeper commitment to Bildung that Blue documents throughout his book.

Although Blue is right to resist the temptation of explaining Nietzsche's later activity in terms of his early interests within the context of his biography, I do think that Blue's account of Nietzsche's youth provides fertile ground for such comparisons and explanations, and so I find the content of the afterword a bit puzzling. This is because Blue devotes the afterword to arguing that his biography ends at the appropriate time: the day Nietzsche left for Basel on April 12, 1869. Blue claims that this is an appropriate time to end the book because it corresponds to the time when Nietzsche turned away from writing autobiographies of the sort Blue discusses.

The most obvious problem with Blue's claim is that Nietzsche writes Ecce Homo near the end of his productive career, an autobiography that bears the subtitle, "how one becomes what one is." Because the subtitle is a variant of Pindar's "Genoi' hoios essi" and so the epigraph affixed to his early essay on Diogenes Laertius, there seems to be a deep continuity between Nietzsche's earliest interests and his latest writings. Blue responds to this objection by distinguishing between autobiographies that present a life in progress and autobiographies that represent a past that is largely complete. Because Nietzsche stopped writing the former in 1869 and only wrote the latter after that date, Blue claims that "Nietzsche ceased to write personal autobiographies of the kind composed during his youth," (320) and so there is some justification for claiming that "the first phase" of Nietzsche's life ended with his departure for Basel (314).

Although one can understand Blue's need to justify his decision to end his account of Nietzsche's life in 1869, it seems to overstate the break and undercut the potential relevance of his biography for understanding Nietzsche's later writings. In my mind, Blue would do better to maintain that although Nietzsche's move to Basel in 1869 is a good stopping point for the purposes of his biography, the ideas central to Nietzsche's youth may very well carry over into his mature writing, and so the continuities between Nietzsche's early and later autobiographies are just as important as their differences. Indeed, the theme of Bildung is central to Nietzsche's 1872 Basel lectures that go under the title of "The Future of Our Educational Institutions [Bildungsanstalten]" and his 1874 essay Schopenhauer as Educator, which includes a variant of "Genoi' hoios essi," and there are good reasons to think that Nietzsche wrote the works of the free spirit, from Human, All Too Human (1878) to The Gay Science (1882) as an exercise in self-formation following the motto of becoming who one is. If this is right, becoming who one is and the related quest for Bildung is a central impetus behind Nietzsche's lectures and works after leaving for Basel and even until the end of his career.

Before concluding, I do not want to leave the reader with the impression that Blue's biography is exclusively about Bildung and Nietzsche's related attempts to give an account of himself at various junctures in his young life. As noted in the introduction, Blue weaves these themes into a traditional biography that contains all the features one would expect from the genre. He spends a good deal of effort detailing Nietzsche's gradual break from religious belief and his family's expectation that he would follow in his father's footsteps by becoming a parson. Blue also explains some of the central ideas that Nietzsche encountered in the works of Emerson, Arthur Schopenhauer, and Friedrich Albert Lange, and the way in which these ideas shaped his early essays like "Fate and History" and "Freedom of the Will and Fate." His biography includes interesting accounts of Nietzsche's membership in Germania, a literary club Nietzsche formed during his time at Schulpforta with two of his closest friends, his membership in Franconia, a fraternity he joined as a university student at Bonn but then soon abandoned, and the leading role he took in the formation of a philological society in Leipzig. Finally, Blue gives the reader a good sense of the various personalities that influenced Nietzsche's early life and includes some bits of gossip, such as the time Nietzsche got drunk in high school, lost his status as a class leader, and shamefully apologized to his mother (159-160).

Although this biography may not be the best way to encounter Nietzsche for the first time, Blue has done a tremendous service to Anglo-American Nietzsche scholarship, and anyone with a serious interest in Nietzsche should consult it. The book provides a well-documented and clear picture of Nietzsche's youth that incorporates substantive reflections on Nietzsche's quest for Bildung and his related interest in autobiography. For these reasons, Blue's work may very well become the second Urbiographie of Nietzsche's life until 1869 that shapes future work -- at least in the Anglo-American context -- on the subject.