The Many and the One: a Philosophical Study of Plural Logics

The Many And The One

Salvatore Florio and Øystein Linnebo, The Many and the One: a Philosophical Study of Plural Logics, Oxford University Press, 2021, 314pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198791522.

Reviewed by Graham Priest, CUNY Graduate Center/University of Melbourne/Ruhr University of Bochum


Plural logics are logics which countenance pluralities. More precisely, they extend the expressive resources of standard logic with a new kind of variable taken to range over pluralities, terms that refer to such, and maybe predicates applying to them. Since the groundbreaking work of George Boolos on the subject in the 1990s, a great deal of work has gone into developing these ideas, exploring their technical aspects, and their philosophical implications. The present book by Salvatore Florio and Øystein Linnebo (hereafter, FL) very much captures the present state of the art. It is written in a clear and accessible way, and is understandable by anyone with a grasp of second-order logic. In many chapters, technical details and proofs are sensibly deferred to appendices, which may be omitted without loss of understanding by anyone with no taste for such things.

The book is no simple textbook, however. It develops technical novelties of its own and, in the light of these, discusses the philosophical claims that are often made about plural logic. It is clearly sympathetic to the topic and its applications, but argues insightfully that many such claims are over-blown. It ends by proposing a new version of plural logic which gives up the standard and apparently obvious view that any condition (satisfied by at least one thing) defines a plurality. This version, it argues, most adequately balances the several philosophical tensions which beset the subject.

The book is clearly written by two philosophical logicians totally in control of their subject. I would go so far as to call this an elegant book. No future work on the area can ignore it.

After a brief introduction (Chapter 1), the book has four parts. Chapters 2 and 3 comprise Part 1, Primitive Plurals. The first of these explains the basic ideas, machinery, and applications, of plural logic. The second considers some arguments against “singularism”, that is, the view that using plural machinery is just a way of talking about single entities of a certain kind, most obviously sets or mereological wholes. Prime amongst such arguments is a pluralist version of Cantor’s Theorem. As the authors show, this can be articulated in a number of different ways; however, they all boil down to the apparent fact that given any domain of objects, there are more pluralities than objects in the domain. The chapter notes that the argument can be resisted if one gives up either the claim that one can quantify over absolutely everything, or unrestricted comprehension for pluralities—the claim that every condition on objects characterises a plurality thereof. This lays the cornerstone for what is to come in due course.

Part 2, Comparisons, compares pluralities with similar machinery. The part comprises three chapters. In Chapter 4, the comparison concerns sets, and the chapter argues for the somewhat counter-intuitive view that pluralities are “needed to account for sets” (55). The objects of comparison in Chapter 5 are mereological sums. The chapter shows that first-order logic plus a standard account of plurals is equivalent to a certain (atomistic) mereology, but argues that there are still reasons for having both plurals and mereological sums. In the final chapter of this part, the objects of comparison are concepts or whatever it is that are the values of second-order variables. The chapter argues that plural logic is not naturally translatable into second-order logic.

Part 3, Plurals and Semantics, is the most technical part of the book. Chapter 7 gives two semantics for a language of plurals. One of these deploys sets to give the semantics. The other is a “homophonic” semantics which uses plurals themselves for the tasks. Both semantics are shown to be viable, given certain assumptions. There is a sensitive but ultimately somewhat inconclusive discussion of which of the semantics is preferable. Chapter 8 contains a discussion of two virtues often claimed for a logic of plurals. The first is that it has a determinacy that second-order logic lacks, due to the existence of “Henkin models” of second-order logic. This argument is problematized by producing the analogue of Henkin models for plural logics. The construction is also deployed to problematize a second frequently made claim, namely that plural logics are ontologically committed to no entities over and above those of the singular quantifiers. A distinction is made between a narrow notion of ontological commitment and a broad notion. It is then argued that plural logic can be seen as committed to the existence of plurals in this broad sense.

It struck me that an important assumption slipped under the radar here, namely that ontological commitment is determined by what one quantifies over. The view is, of course, Quine’s. Though it is still frequently endorsed, Quine bases his argument, in part, on the thought that names do not deliver commitment, since they can be “pegasized away”, that is, treated as definite descriptions. Some decades after Naming and Necessity, I think we know better than this. If a theory contains names that refer to certain objects, it is committed to entities of this kind. That being so, plural logic is committed to certain entities beyond those of the singular variables, simply because the language has names for pluralities which, according to the semantics, refer to them.

The last chapter of this part addresses the issue of “superplurals”, that is, pluralities of pluralities. There are certainly natural-language examples of such things, and, using a very nice tree representation, the chapter argues that these are no more problematic than ordinary plurals. It does concede that certain occurrences of superplurals can be handled in other ways, such as with multigrade predicates, or what it calls “covers”; but it is not very impressed by these devices. I would add that they all appear (to me) to be rather kludgy, and, in any case, primitive superplurals provide a simple and uniform understanding of the locutions in question.

The discussion to this point in the book was somewhat non-committal on a number of issues. However, in the last part, The Logic and Metaphysics of Plurals, the authors come clean on their own views. Chapter 10 is devoted to the relationship between plurals and modals. It argues that plurals are rigid; that is, the members of a plurality do not change across worlds. The discussion takes into account both “necessitism” (the view that all worlds have the same domain), and “contingentism” (that they do not). The discussion is a sensitive one, and draws a nice distinction (novel as far as I know) between metaphysical rigidity and semantic rigidity. Chapter 11 discusses “absolutism”, that is, the claim that one can quantify over absolutely everything; and in particular the tension between this view and the view that one can always singularise a plurality. Its preferred way to resolve the tension is to accept that there are variables that range over all objects, but hold that pluralities themselves are organised in a hierarchy of what amount to types. Essentially, the ability to turn any plurality into a singularity delivers “new” objects—a version of Russell’s Vicious Circle Principle—and so new pluralities. This means that one has to give up unrestricted comprehension for plurals, given that there are still variables which range over all objects. Those familiar with debates concerning sets and proper classes, indefinite extensibility, etc., will experience a sense of déjà vu in this chapter.

Chapter 12 puts all these pieces together, and argues for a novel form of plural logic based on these ideas, termed “Critical Plural Logic”, which does not endorse general comprehension for plurals. It shows that, given the analysis of sets in terms of pluralities advocated in Chapter 4, the account delivers ZF set theory—though this is perhaps not surprising. Since we have given up general comprehension, we need axioms to tell us what pluralities there are; and, for the most part, the plural analogues of the axioms of ZF are taken over. Indeed, one has the sense that FL take ZF and its hierarchical structure as a paradigm, and create Critical Plural Logic in its image.

In what remains of this review, I will take up two of the many interesting issues raised by the book. The first takes us back to the discussion of Chapter 10 concerning the rigidity of plurals. Central to the argument here is an endorsement of an appropriate version of “Leibniz’ Law”:

  • [LL] xx≈yy→(φ(xx)↔φ(yy))

for any φ—including, in particular, those φ in which xx is in the scope of a modal operator—and its simple consequence:

  • [NI] xx≈yy→□xx≈yy

(Here, xx≈yy is a relation expressing the claim that xx and yy have the same components. That is, ∀z(zxxzyy), where  means “is one of the”.) The corresponding principles are, of course, standard in modal logic, and usually made without comment. However, they are not without their problems, and systems without them (“contingent identity systems”) are well known. (See G. Priest, Introduction to Non-Classical Logic, 2nd edn, Cambridge University Press, 2008, Chapter 17.) Moreover, there are several standard counter-examples to the usual principles (see G. Priest, “Metaphysical Necessity: a Skeptical Perspective”, Synthese 198 (2021): 1873–1885, §7) and several of these generalise to plurals.

Let us fix on [NI]. Let xx be the plurality comprising Plato, p, and Aristotle, a. Let s be the sum of Plato’s parts, and s- be those minus his left ear. Let yy be the plurality comprising a and s, Then xxyy. If yy- is the plurality comprising a and s-, then it is not the case that xx≈yy-. But in a world where Plato was born without his left ear, then p=s-, so it is not the case that xx≈yy: xx≈yy-.

Or again, suppose that on the table is a bunch of objects, and that one of these is a lump of clay, l, formed into a statue of the Buddha, b. So b=l. Suppose that there are just two other objects on the table, i and j. Let xx comprise i,j,l, and yy comprise i,j,b. Then xx≈yy. But in another world, l is made into a statue of Socrates, s, and b does not exist. Then at that world it is not the case that xx≈yy, since they have different cardinalities (or maybe the same cardinalities, but one has a non-existent object as a component).

The book does not give an explicit semantics for plural logic with modal operators, though it is straightforward enough to modify the semantics of Chapter 7 to give them. These could verify [LL] and [NI], but using the standard techniques of contingent identity logics, one could equally well give a semantics where these fail. (Essentially, objects have different modal parts at different worlds, so a plurality of objects will also comprise different parts at different worlds.) There is therefore a real issue about the version of Leibniz’ Law which the book assumes.

The second issue I want to take up concerns plural Cantor’s Theorem. As is evident, we are in the realm of paradox here. In set theory, Cantor’s theorem shows that there is no function from the power set of a set into the set; but one may construct one for the set of all sets. Similarly, the plural version of Cantor’s theorem shows that, given a bunch of objects, there is no function from all the pluralities which can be formed from these into the objects themselves. But one may construct one for the plurality of all objects.

The standard strategy for removing the contradiction in ZF is to deny the existence of the set of all sets. FL take the analogous move: deny that there is a plurality of all objects (and so, of course, deny unrestricted plural comprehension). To say the least, this is highly counter-intuitive. To say that one cannot speak of all things is prima facie (and even seconda facie) self-refuting. You can quantify over all things. And all things are self-identical; in which case, it would seem entirely unproblematic to say “Socrates is one of the self-identical things”.

What appears to be the main argument against a plurality of all objects is summarised as follows (276):

To define a plurality, we need to circumscribe some objects. But when we circumscribe some objects, we can use these objects to define yet another object, namely their set, in a way that would not be possible were the objects in question not circumscribed. And since yet another object can be defined, it follows that the circumscribed objects cannot have included all objects. Thus, reality as a whole cannot be circumscribed: there is no universal plurality.

Let us leave aside the apparently self-refuting claim that reality as a whole cannot be circumscribed. The thought here is that being self-identical cannot characterise a plurality. If it did, there would be a set of its components, which is not one of them. Of course it is self-identical; so the characterisation cannot have been of all self-identical things. Here, one may well, of course, demur. Given orthodoxy, a characterisation need not define a set, and so a “new” object.

But in any case, denying unrestricted plural comprehension gives plural logic a complexity which makes it less attractive, and it is certainly disappointing: part of the attraction of plural logic has always been that it can escape some of the limitations of set-theory. If it ends up in the same shackles, this is lost.

It seems to me that it would be much better simply to take the paraconsistent/dialetheic option. We should accept our linguistic/conceptual resources at face value. You can quantify over all objects and have arbitrary pluralities of objects. This is simple, and retains the full power of plurals. True, one has to accept certain paradoxical conclusions, but the contradictions can be quarantined by using a paraconsistent logic. Such can also be done in the case of set-theory as well, of course, but the task is more demanding there. For whether one can obtain a version of naive set theory using a paraconsistent logic, which delvers all that set theory is employed to do, is still a somewhat fraught matter. Unlike set theory, however, the theory of plurals is not subject to such a desideratum. Moreover, even if one rejects a paraconsistent account of sets, given the autonomy of plurals, there is no reason why sets and plurals should be treated in the same way. And as far as I can see, the two semantics of Chapter 7 could be tweaked to deliver a simple semantics for a paraconsistent naive theory of plurals. This is not the place to explore the details, however. Suffice it to say that it is a line of research that beckons.

The possibility of an approach to the issue based on a paraconsistent logic—or any other kind of non-classical logic—receives no mention in the book. Of course, a full exploration of the matter would have to be the topic of another book. But many of the exciting developments concerning paradoxes in the last 50 years have come out of the non-classical stable. So the fact that the thought that a logic of plurals might be based on a non-classical logic does not appear to occur to FL does indicate a blind spot in the book.

This in no way detracts from the merits of what the book does achieve, however, and the achievement is much to be praised.


Many thanks go to FL for their helpful comments on a first draft of this review.