The Many Futures of a Decision

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Jay Lampert, The Many Futures of a Decision, Bloomsbury, 2018, 332pp., $94.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350047785.

Reviewed by James Williams, Deakin University


I couldn't help flinching when the email arrived asking for a review of Jay Lampert's excellent new book. Its title is perhaps a little too topical, in Scotland, in 2018. We are certainly wrestling with the many futures of a decision. So long as you are not among the lab rats, the Brexit referendum result is the perfect experiment for reflecting on the salient questions. Who decided? Which futures? How did they decide? Was it irreversible?

The central question of Lampert's investigation is more theoretical. The point is not to analyse the idea of a decision or an intention, but rather to see what the phenomenology of decisions tell us about the future. The object of enquiry is not any particular future -- such as how decisions driven by English nostalgia might end up pulling Scotland away from old alliances against its will. It is rather about the ontology of the future. Given what we can glean from how we think and act about decisions, what must the future be like?

The book begins with a clear and helpful statement of its argument and outline of its main subjects. The foremost claim is surprising and counter-intuitive, when taken as a thesis on the philosophy of time, since it combines an ethical proposition and an existential one: 'My final conclusion will be: (a) Ethical decisions are lived out in virtual time more than in the "real world." (b) In the branching future, we can carry out any number of incompatible decisions.' (p 3)

If we think of the future as a single line of events happening after the present, this conclusion makes no sense. From that point of view, Brexit, for example, is not a decision with a virtual ethical future, but a decision about future events that will be actualised once we pass them on the line. We shall then be able to inspect them and judge between competing past statements, such as whether Brexit contributed to the division of peoples, or helped the fight for true democracy. There aren't many futures, but one. Against this, Lampert's key move is to refocus us on decisions understood as phenomena that allow us to deduce properties of time, rather than rely on prior assumptions about the linearity or determined nature of time and the future, and then insert the idea of a decision within them. This is a particularly elegant and productive example of a phenomenological reduction.

For Lampert, the time of the decision is when the outcome cannot be known and, more importantly, when the many subsequent twists and turns of later decisions have not yet occurred but are in play with one another. At that point we should think of the future and of the ethics of the decision as about many interconnected virtual futures. Furthermore, we should assess them ethically. There is a nice rigour to this argument, since if we knew the outcome, a decision would be redundant, but because we do not know it there is an ethical import to what we decide.

This study of decisions leads to a picture of the future resembling a hand fan hinged at the decision point, with its veins and patterned material spreading out, in interdependent and yet discernably different lines scattering into the distant future. As anyone who has tried to mend a beautiful Spanish fan knows, when you pull at the material or break a stick, you alter the arrangement of all the rest, perhaps ruining it as a way of cooling yourself and certainly making a child cry. Incidentally, this interdependence is also why, though inspired by David Lewis on possible worlds, Lampert rejects Lewis's claims about the independence of worlds and replaces it with their joint participation in a virtual realm they constitute but are not equivalent to. I used to think the same, on the grounds that Lewis's 'pragmatism' was too close to common sense in terms of eliminating contradictions between possible worlds,[1] but since doing more research on Deleuze's philosophy of time, I think the contrast with Lewis is more about symmetry and asymmetry rather than possible worlds; that is, it is more about supposed non-reversible properties of time, rather than how it divides into paths or not.[2] I'll explain this further in my conclusion.

The refocusing on the decision and on ethics is particularly poignant for Brexit and other political decisions of our epoch. For instance, at the time of the referendum, one of the key decisions by a number of politicians was to disseminate a number of lies. Ethically, it does not matter whether these lies turn out well or badly, again dependent on your point of view. What matters is how they alter the geometry and weighting of manifold virtual time at the point of decision. When you lie, you have an effect on the future, understood as many branches of events which you can then consider together, but not reduce to one. Your decision pulls the branches of the future towards lying, just as repeating a discriminatory image strengthens the image across many different social and cultural spheres.

This explains why Lampert makes good use of game theory (as the best commentators on Brexit have), because game theory is a science weighing the likelihood of these interconnected but branching paths.[3] Nevertheless, I am wary of this confidence in game theory, since it is paradoxical for Lampert. The future of deciding to play a game and according to which rules must itself be a branching future and one not decided by the game you decide to play or its rules. What's the right game theory for this kind of new decision beyond known games? And even if you have an answer to that question, what happens when the next game is against an Evil Demon refusing to play by the new rules and playing by others?

So now I can explain why Lampert's work is existential and why the paths branch. They branch at the point of incompatible yet connected decisions, setting off co-existent virtual future paths (some of which are truly terrifying, of course). For example, Scotland can either be in or out of the UK, not both, but if it is in, then the possibility of being out in future is impacted by the control of Scottish politics by Westminster. These decisions are existential because they touch on the core problems of individual and group existence with respect to decisions; that is, how to keep to them, whether we should keep to them, and whether we can keep to them. The future of decisions is about trust, consistency, fidelity, identity, but also about betrayal, change, adaptation, and reinvention.

To address these questions, Lampert enters into intricate and fascinating discussions with many of the most influential thinkers of phenomenology and existentialism, notably Kierkegaard, Sartre, Husserl, Heidegger, Derrida and Deleuze. It is moot whether the last two fit these categories, but this is only important in putting a question mark over Lampert's description of his own method as phenomenological. It is not obvious that either Derrida or Deleuze is a thinker of phenomena and there is a lot at stake in assuming they are, since it is also not obvious that either of them take decisions as important entities, as opposed to considering them as products of much more complex and intricate textual or metaphysical systems.

Lampert also includes valuable counter-points to the continental tradition by including analytic philosophy (in particular to inform the idea of a decision in relation to an intention and the theory of many possible futures) and political thinkers from both sides of the political spectrum, such as Schmitt and Habermas. This is therefore a rich and rewarding book, as much for those interpretations as for the overall thesis. However, it isn't a book for beginners, since the argumentation is often quite dense and makes a lot of assumptions about prior knowledge. This is not a criticism -- the assumptions and style come with good reason -- but it is a warning, should anyone turn to the book as an introduction to these thinkers or to the philosophy of time.

As an existential philosophy of time with political and ethical consequences, Lampert's work takes a very strong position, modestly but in some ways deceptively. If we return to the apparently quite simple statement of his conclusions, we see the use of the highly slippery verb 'can', supposedly indicating a possibility: 'we can carry out any number of incompatible decisions'. The crucial point is that he must mean we can always carry them out; that is, there are no decisions that we cannot branch out from, into an incompatible path, and we should take account of this in thinking about the future and about our decisions.

If he doesn't mean that, then his conclusion about the branching nature of the future does not follow. Yet this statement of 'always' being able to branch out is deeply problematic when applied to decisions about death. For a phenomenology and existentialism about time and the future, Lampert says very little, almost nothing, on decisions about dying and killing: 'Decisions resulting in somebody's death, for example, clearly limit variation . . .' (p 290) What about the death of everybody, or the decider's? Do those have branches, or something much more terminal and uniform?

To conclude, I should say that I think Lampert is completely wrong about the future. The wrongness stems from his focus on a decision, as if there were such a thing. By starting with decisions it is fairly easy to think then of interconnected future paths traced back to the decision; for example, in the UK and in the EU, no more UK, but an independent Scotland, no more EU, and so on. The problem is that the decision always happens before the decision. It is made in the past. It is also that the decision happens after the decision. It is made by the future and recast by the future. So the right image is never of a fan -- and of forking paths branching from decisions -- but rather of a sea, like the English Channel, stretching in all directions around a fishing boat, threatening and bountiful. The fan and the paths are only ever written on the sea. What's the difference? What's at stake here?

Firstly, it is that the future is the past. A decision makes the past, all of it, as much as it branches the future. Brexit was a decision about changing who we were, and it hurts so much because we were already different and divided peoples -- we just didn't accept it. Secondly, it is that a decision is not a point, but a zone, with vague boundaries artificially imposed on ever wider waves. When did Brexit happen? When was it decided? Thirdly, it is that a decision is a call from the future, not a decision about it; the future has effects on us, its draw upon us in returning cycles. We remember how it drew us in last time. The future is an actor and, so long as we think of it as weighted branches punctuated by decisions, we'll miss how it is a much less coherent, but much more important condition for wanting to go on at all -- for being able to go on at all. The branching of time does not explain its momentum or direction. That's why Brexit induces so much despair, not because we don't like many of the branches, but because it seems to take all of them away, slowly, then perhaps too quickly . . .

[1] James Williams, 'Deleuze and Lewis: the Real Virtual or Real Possible Worlds' in The Transversal Thought of Gilles Deleuze: Encounters and Influences, Manchester: Clinamen Press, 2005, pp 101-28, p 128

[2] James Williams, Gilles Deleuze's Philosophy of Time: a Critical Introduction and Guide, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, p 182

[3] Simon Wren-Lewis, The Lies We Were Told, Bristol University Press, 2018