The Many Moral Rationalisms

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Karen Jones and François Schroeter (eds.), The Many Moral Rationalisms, Oxford University Press, 2018, 309pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198797074.

Reviewed by Nin Kirkham, The University of Western Australia


When reading Hume's spirited articulation of moral sentimentalism and his powerful empiricist critique of just about everything awoke Kant from his dogmatic slumbers and prompted him, among other things, to produce the Groundwork, little did he know that he would be responsible for what would turn out to be the most influential version of one side of a metaethical debate that has now raged for centuries. This book is the latest instalment, devoted to showcasing a range of contemporary positions and controversies within the rationalist tradition, broadly understood.

The collection is comprised of fourteen essays (including the introduction), which are organised into three sections: "Normativity"; "Epistemology and Meaning"; and "Psychology". Each section contains rather a diverse smorgasbord of views. In the manner of a respectable smorgasbord, there is something for almost everyone, even those with the most specific of tastes, but nothing Michelin-starred. What the book does do is give the reader the opportunity to appreciate fully the diverse range of contemporary views that come under the rather sparse-sounding rubric of moral rationalism.

The introductory essay, by François Schroeter, Karen Jones and Laura Schroeter, provides a candid assessment of the challenges faced by those defending moral rationalism, especially in a philosophical environment where there is widespread adherence to naturalism. Ethical naturalists, the authors point out, are committed to the idea that if we are to accept normativity as real, a place must be found for normative and evaluative phenomena in the natural world, a place at least consistent with the findings of the biological and psychological sciences. In particular, they claim that any moral rationalism worthy of serious consideration must be able to give some account of how human capacities for normative judgments fit into an evolutionary story about the development of proto-moral capacities and behaviours in our evolutionary ancestors (1). That is, it must be able to answer to the evolutionary 'continuity constraint'.

Many contemporary moral rationalists have responded to the naturalist challenge by attempting to dismiss or diminish the 'continuity constraint', arguing that empirical findings about human psychology are uncompelling as a critique of human exceptionalism, and defending a non-naturalist version of rationalist moral realism. In contrast, Schroeter, Jones and Schroeter challenge moral rationalists to find new iterations of the theory which robustly make space for naturalism. That the contributors articulate some aspect of a version of moral rationalism that meets this so-called 'continuity constraint' forms the fundamental entreaty of this volume.

The introduction outlines what the authors consider to be the four core theses of moral rationalism: 'reason is the source of moral judgments'; 'moral requirements are grounded in the deliverances of practical reason'; 'moral requirements are knowable a priori'; and 'moral requirements entail valid reasons for actions' (2). They make a range of suggestions for how these theses might be best interpreted and how they might be recombined into plausible 'naturalist appeasing' versions of rationalism. But their challenge is not merely to develop an account of moral rationalism that fits with naturalism, but also one that meets their considered desiderata for a coherent package of rationalist views. Their desiderata have three aspects: preserving a robust distinction between rationalism and sentimentalism (what counts as robust, in this sense, will be highly contestable); that the theory be sufficiently similar to traditional forms of rationalism so as to be properly considered an heir of the tradition; and that the theory be founded on a plausible philosophical framework that can explain the conceptual relationships between the basic theses and how and why they work together (14). Schroeter, Jones and Schroeter conclude by suggesting an example of what they consider to be an acceptable combination of views -- a combination which is coherent, attractive and worthy of further philosophical development.

On to the papers. I won't discuss or even describe all of them. In my estimation, some of the papers are dull, predictable, and self-referential but there are several that really sparkle. Julia Markovits' contribution is one of these. Coming in the first section -- "Normativity" -- which includes a number of papers all ostensibly focused on articulating and defending some version of Kant's thesis that moral requirements are the grounds for valid reasons for action, Markovits' paper focuses on Kant's Formula of Humanity. It is beautifully written and tightly argued. It seeks to show that the formal conditions of the very act of valuing contingent ends provides us with reason to think that the rational nature capable both of producing contingent ends and of being their source of their value, is valuable in itself. As part of her discussion, Markovits demonstrates how she thinks we should answer Rae Langton's worry that Maria von Herbert, Kant's very depressed pen-pal, has no intrinsic value in the Kantian sense because she doesn't value anything, including herself. Markovits explains that the most 'pressing version of the problem of Maria von Herbert' rests on a slight mischaracterization of Kant's understanding of the source of the intrinsic value of agents. Markovits argues that our recognition of Maria's intrinsic value comes not from her own self-evaluation (as valueless) but rather from our recognition that her value (intrinsic and unconditioned) must be just like our own. The paper ends with a lovely parallel to Descartes' cogito -- in order to count as theoretically rational, we cannot deny that if we are thinking, we must exist. Likewise, there is one substantive end that we must all will, at the risk of practical irrationality, if we are to be the kinds of beings that will anything at all; that of humanity. (46)

Later in the volume comes another surprising and interesting paper, 'Stupid Goodness', by Garrett Cullity. The paper comes in the third section -- "Psychology" -- and is a spirited defence, and perhaps rehabilitation, of what Cullity calls 'stupid goodness', to whit 'an inarticulate responsiveness to moral reasons' (228). Cullity's defence is framed as being founded on a version of moral rationalism: 'morality gives us reasons, reasons independent of the responses we have to them, moral goodness is primarily responding to these reasons' (228). This is a delightful paper which begins by drawing a picture of Milton's Satan as the quintessence of stupid goodness and then seeks to answer three questions about the significance of our ability or inability to articulate moral reasons. In answering these questions, Cullity concludes that, yes, you can respond to a moral reason without being able to articulate it and that, yes, moral articulacy is valuable, but so is moral inarticulacy -- stupid goodness -- in some respects. Cullity's third question, 'what is the value of engaging in moral reasoning?' (243) is answered in light of the value he has given to stupid goodness. Moral reasoning is an important and valuable pursuit but, Cullity argues, it carries a two-fold risk. If we don't succeed in capturing all of the reasons in our theory it can make us blind to important aspects of morality and, perhaps worse, sometimes articulacy can be at the expense of our direct (moral) connection with others. Articulating reasons can get in the way of 'stupid' or inarticulate goodness, goodness that apprehends the moral phenomenon directly and is taken by it (245).

A final essay worth mentioning in detail is written by Joshua May, entitled 'The Limits of Emotion in Moral Judgement', and the final instalment in the "Psychology" section. I wouldn't say it is beautifully written, but it is a tightly argued paper that contains a great deal of food for thought. The stated purpose of this volume in the introductory essay was to encourage the articulation of versions of rationalism which engaged productively with naturalism and, in particular, took seriously the findings from evolutionary biology and psychology. And for many moral philosophers the psychological findings coming from experimental philosophy and psychology regarding the role of emotions in forming our moral judgments provide an almost irresistible challenge to the foundations of moral rationalism. For instance, the purported role of disgust in shaping the intensity of our moral judgments seems to put a great deal of pressure on the notion that reason is the source of moral judgments, and provides at least the limited foundation for the idea that by themselves the emotions may be a source of moralising. So, in this final essay, May takes issue with a whole range of psychological findings and attempts to show how they are less of a problem for rationalists than one might have immediately thought. And he does a valiant job of it. He argues, convincingly, that finding a middle path here may prove to be crucial. We don't have to abandon naturalism and psychological realism in favour of ethical non-naturalism, nor do we have to embrace sentimentalism. But in light of what we are coming to know about the role of emotions in ethical reasoning, rationalists, May points out, should admit that moral understandings often occur automatically; in the absence of rational reflection, they don't, however, have to go so far as admitting that 'mere feelings' are necessary for moral cognition (303).

I have focused, unapologetically, on what I personally found interesting in the book, but there are a number of other excellent papers that make this volume well worth reading. Michael Smith elucidates the variety of moral rationalisms in 'Three Kinds of Moral Rationalism', Nicholas Southwood takes issue with constructivism's attempt to derive normativity from the nature of practical reason in 'Constructivism and the Normativity of Practical Reason' and Jones uses her contribution to evaluate a number of objections to the rationalist account of conscious reflective judgment in light of her refreshingly blunt admission that it plays a rather small part in our day-to-day lives, but can often be found in the service of 'rationalising bullshit'. On balance, the book is an impressive collection of papers, well-organised, and offers a diverse range of views across the core issues that beset moral rationalism.