The Material of Knowledge: Feminist Disclosures

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Susan Hekman, The Material of Knowledge: Feminist Disclosures, Indiana University Press, 2010, 145pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253221964.

Reviewed by Edrie Sobstyl, Douglas College


The relationship between feminism and postmodernism is complex, and feminists can reasonably be expected to disagree about its nature. On the one hand, we should recognize that there are many feminist theories, some of which are in tension with one another, and that feminist postmodernism is but one subset of these theories. On this reading, there are many versions of feminist theorizing that do not share in all or even any of the central commitments and strategies of postmodern theorizing. This old-fashioned way of thinking may drag some tiresome baggage along with it, but it has the merit of being well-established in the history of feminist philosophies.

On the other hand, one could make the case that very nearly all feminist theorizing is a form of postmodernism, inasmuch as it criticizes some of the central analytic categories of modernity (truth, knowledge, the subject) and tends toward a common, although not unanimous, appeal to some form of constructivist epistemology. This latter approach, while defensible, will feel uncomfortable to many feminists, appearing to gain unity across feminist theorizing at the expense of respect for significant differences.

In The Material of Knowledge: Feminist Disclosures, Susan Hekman positions feminist theory (in the singular) at the forefront of what she argues is an emerging sea change in critical thought, a radical retooling which she claims will help to correct some of the excesses of postmodernism, and shake us out of our current theoretical impasse. She does this by examining an impressive range of diverse theorists and scrutinizing them for common themes, especially rejection of linguistic constructionism, and some kind of détente with materiality and agency. This examination brings the nature of the theoretical impasse into sharp focus -- linguistic constructionism has fostered a fatally compromised view of knowledge, unable to make contact with the materiality of knowers and known, and politically toothless. What is needed is not a reconciliation of the warring poles of material and discursive, Hekman argues, but a new path that recognizes the interaction and intra-action of the constructive role of language with the irreducible force of the real. The results of her search comprise a series of what (following Bruno Latour) she calls new "settlements" -- a charged term that invokes intellectual pioneering, but also a sense of finality and even resignation. Wherever we go from here, Hekman's use of this term suggests, there is a lot of hard work ahead.

The urgency of the problems Hekman identifies and the plausibility of the new approach she proposes hinge in part on the reader's view of the relationship between feminism and postmodernism. For the audience that sees the two as largely coextensive, Hekman's work will be a daring and provocative challenge, eagle-eyed in its critique and bold in its demand for a social ontology. This audience may even object that Hekman concedes too much to more modernist ideals, but the conversation that is sure to ensue cannot help but be fruitful, inside feminist philosophy and out. Feminists unattached to postmodernism may not be persuaded that the theoretical problems Hekman identifies are new, or even especially pressing, but this doesn't diminish her book's importance. Her project offers some resources to help build much-needed bridges between increasingly distant feminist territories. And no matter one's view regarding postmodernism, Hekman is spot on when she argues that feminist theorists are still not taken seriously even by those who should most welcome our insights, politically and philosophically.

Hekman explores four new settlements, which she draws from the philosophy of science, analytic philosophy, Foucault, and feminism. Each of these explorations is quite short, especially given the magnitude of the project, and highly contentious. Turning to the first settlement, philosophers of science, for example, will wonder why the philosophy of science has been almost entirely conflated with SSK (sociology of scientific knowledge), and will be surprised to learn that the linguistic turn originated in the work of Thomas Kuhn. It is reasonable to note some shared interests and strategies between SSK and contemporary philosophy of science, of course, but the charge of theoretical impasse, or even theoretical bankruptcy, applies much more readily to the former than to the latter. It is equally plausible to attribute "a" linguistic turn to Kuhn, as Stefano Gattei does in his 2008 book, but "the" linguistic turn is a phrase normally reserved for a much older and larger set of problems (and responses) than the ones Hekman investigates. And while many would still agree with her that a deeply problematic linguistic constructionism is one inevitable outcome of the linguistic turn, for philosophers of science there is just more than that at stake in both the linguistic turn and post-Kuhnian science. These are not particularly postmodern concerns, but they do engage many contemporary feminist philosophers of science and they do influence the epistemologies feminist philosophers of science are developing. Hekman explains with admirable clarity why philosophy of science matters so crucially to feminism, and raises critical questions about the interface of science and the social/political contexts in which it is practiced, so it is important not to let any gaps or infelicities in her presentation obscure the complex arc of her task.

Hekman works through each of her new settlements in turn, bringing disparate theoretical positions together around her central concerns. In each case, as for the philosophy of science, one can see the clear potential for disagreement with some of the interpretations Hekman offers. Scholars of Wittgenstein, Foucault, and Marx, for example, will surely object to some of her analyses, and to the fact that her brief readings of these theorists are a bit isolated from larger conversations about their work. This concern is not easily dismissed, but it is important not to overemphasize it, either. Hekman is not attempting to revise the received view of any writers in particular so much as she is trying to show that the tools needed to defeat the postmodern impasse and develop a more workable view of the relationship between language and reality are already present in a surprising array of critics -- often, in fact, in writers who have little else in common with each other. This discovery is worth having made. One cannot do justice to the often intricate assembly of each of Hekman's new settlements in a short review, and some of these settlements are, unsurprisingly, just more settled than others. But the fourth and final settlement, in which the leadership of feminist theorists and some degree of convergence among feminist theorists on common ground is established, is the richest -- and the most combative. One sincerely hopes for further examination and even a book-length treatment of the issues Hekman raises in this short chapter.

More generally, though, a backlash against linguistic constructionism is the searchlight Hekman wields in seeking resources for her new settlements, which must have made the hunt rather easy. But it is important to note that constructionism of any kind is a contested notion in need of careful explication. This is perhaps more readily apparent in the case of social constructionism, which has been theorized recklessly ("reality is merely a social construct"), cautiously ("our knowledge of reality is socially constructed"), and countless ways in between. Hekman can be forgiven for wanting to carve off a manageable portion of the challenges here, to be sure. But she does tend to treat the linguistic turn and social/linguistic construction as aspects of the same singular phenomenon, and insists that human knowledge is constructed by human concepts. It is this claim that needs to be clarified and defended in much greater detail, especially if it is to bear the weight of profound truth that Hekman assigns it. Neither linguistic nor social constructionism are one thing, and although they are related, they are also not the same thing.

Still, it is easy to see how some version of linguistic constructionism would give rise to dangerous problems for postmodern approaches to knowledge, epistemically privileging the linguistic/discursive as they do. Whether this gives rise to an immediate need for a new social ontology that embraces materiality, as Hekman argues it does, is not so clear. She argues, for example, that feminists in particular need to "bring the material back". Here the different perspectives on the relationship between feminism and postmodernism, described above, really matter. For those who see all feminism as a form of postmodernism, this claim may have a surface plausibility. Feminists may have a special stake in rescuing reality in order to ground their political statements on behalf of women, and may rightly be apprehensive of the political futility that accompanies a perilous postmodern relativism. But outside of postmodern approaches, the unstable dichotomy of material and discursive has not always entailed a disavowal of the real. We can clearly accept a role for social and linguistic construction of knowledge without giving reality away, as numerous theorists have demonstrated. Indeed, we can actually make the notion of reality more robust by attending to the way our knowledge of it differs depending on how we construct that knowledge. Hekman is clearly aware of this, as her discussion of the new settlement in analytic philosophy shows. If her point is to persuade a feminist postmodernist audience, however, the argument may not be sufficiently forceful given the deep suspicion this audience has of ontology.

Similarly, Hekman's political defense of realism has not met with much favour in the past. The claim that the real needs to be reintroduced or rescued because it is good for feminism is an instrumental assumption, not an argument. The net effect of this assumption can actually be to weaken political claims made on behalf of women, opening feminist theory to the charge of treating ontology as a substitute for ideology. This is especially troubling considering that much feminist work in the last thirty years has drawn attention to this very problem in androcentric science. Hekman's elaboration of the feminist settlement includes Nancy Tuana's work on Hurricane Katrina, and especially Karen Barad's intra-actionism, including its application to reading sonograms. Ironically, Hekman's discussion here shows that we don't require any instrumental assumptions about how feminist politics needs materiality -- materiality is always inescapably present in our practices in the world, and will exert itself with, against, and through us. There's no avoiding it. When contrasted with recent feminist work on the body, as exemplified by Elizabeth Grosz, Annemarie Mol, Elizabeth Wilson, Vicky Kirby, and others, this point is made even clearer.

Much is made, especially in the fourth settlement, of postmodern hostility toward untenable conceptual dichotomies or dualistic forms of thought -- culture/nature, language/reality, objectivist/constructivist, and so on. A problem with these pesky dichotomies, allegedly hallmarks of modernity, is that once they've been articulated, we seem stuck with them. Any effort to reconfigure these concepts and the relation between them starts to feel like it can only assume and hence reinforce the dichotomies themselves. Throughout the book, Hekman attempts to grapple with this problem, with varying degrees of success. Sometimes she appears relatively unconcerned about reinscribing troublesome dichotomies, while at other times she overtly urges us to turn our backs on them. We can't undo modernism, but we can toss these conceptual pairs into Andrew Pickering's mangle, a metaphor Hekman wields frequently throughout the book, and see what comes out. In the final chapter, Hekman shifts terrain to what she terms disclosure, and it is here that many of the book's dissimilar threads start to come together. What comes out of the mangle, what results from intra-action, what is disclosed (with help from Marx) is a gap that needs to be filled by a social ontology. Hekman does not say enough about the contours of this envisioned ontology to assess its utility in confronting postmodernism's theoretical impasse, but it is clear that, if the situation is as dire as Hekman has argued, there can be no simple fix. Social ontology can no more solve our political problems than social epistemology can.

Even if feminist theorizing, or critical social theorizing in general, is at an impasse -- an unlikely proposition on the face of it -- it is unreasonable to suppose that all of our theories have reached the same impasse, that we reached it by the same route, or that we can or should take the same path out of it. From this perspective, some of Hekman's unqualified pronouncements (e.g., that postmodernism has transformed feminism, that social constructionism dominates the academy, or that feminists are suspicious of Marx) just ring hollow, and much of her argument appears overstated. Future work in this vein must narrow the scope of the project, provide more support for its most controversial claims, clarify the audience, and demonstrate exactly how social ontology may be able to free us of the excesses of postmodernism.