The Matter and Form of Maimonides' Guide

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Josef Stern, The Matter and Form of Maimonides' Guide, Harvard University Press, 2013, 448pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674051607.

Reviewed by Benjamin Pollock, Michigan State University


In the Introduction to the Guide of the Perplexed, Maimonides famously informs his readers of both the challenges they will face and the rewards they may reap if they study his book properly. Maimonides claims he will allow truth to be glimpsed by his readers, only to have that truth concealed once again. He will address metaphysical secrets not "completely known to anyone among us," but will follow the methods of the rabbinic Sages who conveyed truths through riddles and parables. Maimonides promises he has chosen his words "with great exactness," and that even statements which appear out of place have been put there intentionally. He warns that he has scattered indications of his teachings about metaphysics throughout the book, and hence that to understand them, the reader will have to find these hints and connect them. He tells his readers to be prepared for contradictions, some of which he has concealed so that the vulgar will not be aware of them. If this is not your idea of a pleasant reading experience, consider the payoff: the virtuous reader who follows Maimonides' guidance is promised liberation from perplexity, perfection, and tranquility.

Given the extent of Maimonides' hints, warnings, and promises, it is perhaps no surprise that so much of the scholarship on the Guide through the ages -- and over the last fifty years in particular -- has been devoted to figuring out exactly what Maimonides' hidden philosophical views really were. What metaphysical doctrine is meant to flash out of the riddles and parables of the book? What account of truth lies scattered among its pages? In cases where contradictory views are conveyed, to which view did Maimonides commit himself, and which view did he introduce instead as a way to conceal his true opinion from the vulgar?

Josef Stern's remarkable new book will breathe new life into scholarly discussions of Maimonides' thought precisely because it breaks with the quest to discover Maimonides' secret doctrine that has so dominated scholarship in the field. Taking an explicit stand against what he designates as "dogmatic" readings of the Guide, Stern situates Maimonides instead within the skeptical tradition. On Stern's reading, Maimonides does not use the Guide's parables and contradictions to conceal/reveal his knowledge of secret metaphysical truths for the important reason that he holds human beings to be incapable of metaphysical knowledge as such. Instead, Stern identifies the array of parables, riddles, and contradictions in the Guide as the components of spiritual exercises intended to guide readers towards the recognition of the inherent limitations of the human being's matter-bound intellect, and thereby towards the kind of philosophical life still possible for human beings given their condition.

Stern's title conveys the overarching claim of his book: to make sense of the relationship between the matter and the form of the Guide -- between its philosophical content and the parabolic, riddling form through which its content is conveyed -- one must understand Maimonides' views regarding the intertwining of matter and form within the human being and the world she inhabits. Since Maimonides holds that the human being's intellect is always matter-bound, Stern argues, he takes the Peripatetic ideal of a fully-actualized intellect conjoined with the Active Intellect to be unrealizable for human beings. The Guide, Stern suggests, aims to assist his philosophical readers in coming to terms with their embodied state; it introduces parables as the medium best suited to embodied philosophical expression and communication; and it introduces an alternative model of perfection to that of disembodied intellectual perfection, a model which Stern suggests is best understood as close kin to the Pyrrhonist path to ataraxia.

The view of philosophy that Stern suggests stands behind the Guide is, loosely speaking, the Hellenistic view of philosophy as a "way of life." According to this view, identified and popularized by Pierre Hadot, philosophy is not simply the theoretical pursuit of knowledge and training in logical argument towards this end. Rather, philosophy is a comprehensive way of life directed towards perfection and happiness. For the schools in question -- the skeptical among them -- the philosophical way of life involved intellectual cultivation, but it likewise involved the cultivation of certain dispositions and behaviors, and a certain comportment towards life. It also involved exercises designed to train students to master both the intellectual and practical aspects of the perfect life and to help students overcome the obstacles that stand in the way of such a life.

Stern suggests we should read Maimonides against the background of this view of philosophy as a way of life. The different chapters of Stern's book introduce us to the arguments, parables, and directives of the Guide as components of spiritual exercises that often employ skeptical methods (e.g., equipollence of opposing metaphysical positions yielding suspension of judgment) to arrive at skeptical aims (e.g., tranquility). The skeptical life is then, broadly speaking, the life that Maimonides is claimed to put forward as most perfect for human beings in the light of their matter-bound condition. But in Stern's account, Maimonides' is not an unmitigated Pyrrhonism. According to Stern, Maimonides does not deny the possibility of scientific knowledge within the bounds of sublunar physics ("knowledge of what is beneath the heavens"), nor does he direct his skepticism at beliefs about the metaphysical. And Maimonides continues to direct his readers to a life of philosophical practices oriented and regulated by the ideal of intellectual perfection, even as he guides them to come to terms with the limits of the human intellect that render realizing this ideal impossible.

At the end of the review, I will raise some questions about the coherence of the life towards which Stern suggests the Guide's exercises direct its readers. On the whole, however, Stern's skeptical reading of Maimonides is refreshing and rewarding. Along the way to painting a new picture of Maimonides' philosophical project in toto, moreover, Stern makes original contributions to our understanding of the Guide at the level of the particulars. He offers a new theory of Maimonides' hermeneutic approach to parables; he clarifies Maimonides' definition of scientific knowledge through a distinction between different kinds of demonstrative arguments; he presents a compelling account of the purpose of Torah commandments as spiritual exercises that train the practitioner for intellectual worship of the divine. Finally, Stern's skeptical approach opens up exciting and newly-illuminating interpretations of those very parables that have perennially sent students of the Guide in search of Maimonides' hidden doctrine.

The first chapter introduces readers to the stakes involved in a skeptical reading of the Guide. In its second chapter, Stern presents his innovative approach to the literary structure and function of parables as Maimonides reads and writes them. Along the way he highlights interesting parallels between Maimonides' approach to parables and both the Jewish tradition of Scriptural commentary and the Neoplatonic interpretation of Greek myth. Since parables are capable of articulating true content within an imaginative structure, Maimonides takes the parable to be the mode of philosophical communication and expression most suited to the human being's matter-bound intellect. In cases where the philosopher seeks to communicate carefully some scientific knowledge he has attained -- e.g., a demonstrative truth from the domain of mathematics or natural science -- he might choose to convey that knowledge through a parable for pedagogic or political reasons. In the most interesting case, however, parables allow philosophers to express and communicate their own incomplete grasp of certain metaphysical truths, which -- due to their being apprehended only fragmentarily -- cannot be expressed in propositional form or laid out in the form of a science. In such cases, Stern explains, the content of parables may be said to flash out at readers not because it is being deliberately withheld, but because it is inherently beyond the human being's scientific grasp.

Now, parables are effective media for philosophical expression and communication, in Maimonides' view, because they are inherently multivalent texts. While Maimonides regularly appears to discuss two levels of meanings in a parable, Stern uses a close reading of two back-to-back parables about parables, which Maimonides cites in the Guide's introduction, in order to argue that Maimonides identifies three levels of meaning in the parable. The parable's outermost layer conveys its vulgar meaning, a meaning determined wholly by the words of the parable and by what the imagination perceives in them. Beneath this outermost layer, Stern suggests, Maimonides points to two further layers of meaning: an "external parabolic meaning" which teaches practical wisdom (including beliefs and values) for members of a community, and an "inner parabolic meaning" which hints at some further teaching for those individuals seeking theoretical wisdom. In the parables that Stern interprets in the chapters that follow, this inner parabolic meaning often entails a skeptical teaching about the contents of the external layers of the parable.

Stern intends his account of the multivalence of Maimonides' parables to push against the political interpretation of Maimonides' parables that has dominated the scholarly literature since Leo Strauss. According to this interpretation, of two levels of meaning in a Maimonidean parable, the outer is exoteric, i.e., it contains teachings meant for the vulgar masses of the community which aid political stability, while the inner meaning is esoteric, containing Maimonides' true teaching, a teaching whose heterodoxy would threaten philosopher and community were they taught explicitly. Against this view Stern argues that Maimonides nowhere claims that the external and internal meanings of parables are intended for different audiences, or that they necessarily stand in tension with one another, or that the inner meaning is what a parable's author truly holds while its outer meaning is a noble lie intended for public consumption. To the contrary, Stern argues, Maimonides identifies both external and inner parabolic levels of meaning as wisdom; they are distinguished rather as are practical and theoretical wisdom.

I will express some reservations over Stern's account of the Maimonidean parable below. But if we are to judge Stern's theory based on its results -- i.e., the interpretations of Maimonidean parables that Stern offers on its basis -- it is enormously fruitful. Stern's third chapter gives readers a first example of such an interpretation, devoted to Maimonides' account of the Garden of Eden in the Guide I:2. On the dominant dogmatic reading of the Guide, Maimonides' interpretation of the Garden of Eden narrative preserves intellectual perfection as the human ideal -- as the "image of God" according to which human beings were created. The Biblical Adam fell away from this ideal when he occupied himself with the desires and imaginings of his material side, but human beings can aspire to actualize this ideal once again through the proper activation of their intellects.

In a remarkably sensitive reading of the text, however, Stern shows this to be the external parabolic meaning of the story, beneath which Maimonides conveys a different, skeptical teaching. On this inner level of the parable, Stern shows, Adam's sin involves not the turn away from the intellect, but rather the transition from a modest engagement with those truths accessible to human beings to an excessive desire for metaphysical knowledge beyond the scope of human cognitive abilities. In opposition to the sinning Adam of the Garden, and in opposition as well to the rabbinic heretic Aher, Maimonides holds up the rabbinic sage Aqiba as an alternative model of human perfection. Aqiba's greatness, according to Stern's Maimonides, lies in the fact that he recognizes his embodied state and the limitations that come with it. As a result, he "refrains and holds back" from the quest for metaphysical knowledge which, as an embodied intellect, he is inherently incapable of attaining. Just as the Pyrrhonist's suspension of judgment frees him from the anxiety that accompanies the quest for certainty and leads him to tranquility, so Maimonides' Aqiba surrenders "that very desire or concern that leads one to endlessly seek unattainable knowledge" (86), trains himself "not even to desire to know what he could not know" (91), and finds peace. Now, Stern insists that Maimonides still upholds the intellectual perfection touted in the external meaning of the Garden of Eden parable as a regulative ideal, but the innovation of his proposed inner parabolic meaning of the story is rather the skeptical model of perfection personified by Aqiba. Moreover, Stern suggests that the praise for God with which Maimonides ends his interpretation of the Garden parable is itself an expression of the skeptical conclusion to the exercise of thinking through to the parable's inner meaning: "Praise be to the Master of the will whose aims and wisdom cannot be apprehended!" [italics mine].

In the fourth chapter, Stern provides background for Maimonides' view of matter from Aristotelian sublunar physics. He raises questions that were in play for Maimonides regarding immaterial causation and the explanation for composite material substances, and begins to address the subject of the limits matter places upon the intellect. In the fifth and sixth chapters, Stern shows how Maimonides brings the limits of matter on the intellect to bear on the question of the knowability of God.

Chapter Five addresses proofs for God's existence. Against even moderate dogmatic readings that assert that Maimonides' proofs for God's existence show that he held at least some knowledge of God to be possible, Stern points to two crucial distinctions in Maimonides' thought that undermine such dogmatic claims: the distinction between demonstrations propter quid and quia, and the consequent distinction between knowledge and certain belief. According to Stern, Maimonides only considers propter quid demonstrations (which show both that a conclusion holds and the reason that conclusion holds) to amount to scientific knowledge. Since the proofs Maimonides introduces for God's existence are quia (i.e., they show merely that the conclusion holds and not the reason), he can't have considered them the basis for metaphysical knowledge. On the other hand, Stern suggests that Maimonides' denial of metaphysical knowledge does not amount to a denial of certain belief. Quia arguments can be assembled that demonstrate regarding a given proposition p that it could in no way be denied or be different. In such a case, one would be justified in believing with certainty in p without knowing p. Such is the case for Maimonides, Stern claims, with regard to God's existence. Moreover, Stern shows how Maimonides leads his readers to such certain belief in God as the necessarily Existent in virtue of Its own essence through a skeptical reflection on proofs from the "heavens" to God's existence.

On Stern's striking interpretation, furthermore, Maimonides' infamously perplexing allusion in Guide II: 30 to a rabbinic Midrash about Sammael and the Serpent in the Garden of Eden comes to convey precisely this condition human beings find themselves in, i.e., capable of belief, but incapable of knowledge regarding God as ruler of the world. Here too, Stern suggests, Maimonides recommends refraining and "holding back" at the limits beyond which knowledge is impossible. But Stern again presents Maimonides' skepticism about metaphysical knowledge as coupled with his continued commitment to the ideal of intellectual perfection. Indeed, alongside the Aqibean model of tranquility in the face of the limits of human knowledge, Stern suggests Maimonides presents the model of Moses who, through humbly "holding back" before God, in fact comes to attain an intellectual cognition he would not have attained otherwise. The model of Moses, Stern claims, depicts "the transformative power of the spiritual exercise to refrain and hold back. . . . By taming one's intellectual, imaginative, and bodily appetites through intellectual epoché, new intellectual resources and even powers open up." (189).

Stern's sixth chapter explores Maimonides' view that the very logical syntax of propositions undermines the possibility of human knowledge of God. In this context, skeptical epoché is conjured out of the following epistemological problem: God is demonstrably One, but we cannot express God's unity without doing so through a logical syntax of subject and predicate that represents God as composite. According to Stern, this antinomy is the inner meaning of Maimonides' discussion of divine attributes and Jewish prayer in the Guide I: 50-63. According to their external meaning, Stern suggests, these chapters reject the attribution of affirmative attributes to God but affirm as legitimate the attribution of attributes of action and of negations of privations to the divine. According to their inner meaning, however, Stern suggests these chapters reject all attributes as contradicting divine unity, and thereby raise serious questions about whether the descriptions of the divine in Jewish prayer might in fact be idolatrous. Faced with the incompatibility of God's oneness, on the one hand, and the composite form of any human expression of this oneness, on the other, Maimonides is shown once again to be moved through epoché to an experience of dazzlement before God.

In the seventh chapter, Stern addresses the parable of the palace in the Guide III:51. Here, once again, where dogmatic readers have found evidence for the view that at least some human beings can attain an intellectual perfection that will bring them into the inner chamber of God's palace, Stern unearths evidence for a compelling skeptical interpretation. Why, Stern asks, is the human being (Moses) whose perfection leads him into "the presence of the ruler" described by Maimonides as "putting questions and receiving answers, speaking and being spoken to, in that holy place" (252)? Such an exchange with the divine intimates, Stern points out, not an immediate conjunction with the Active Intellect but rather the very kind of skeptical back-and-forth that leads through equipollence to the suspension of judgment. Stern offers a fascinating reading, drawing on recent scholarship on changes in Maimonides' cosmological views, that suggests that the content of this back-and-forth in God's chamber turns around arguments for and against the theory of separate intellects. Even the most elevated human individual, depicted in this parable as intimate with the divine, Stern thus argues, models an Aqibean perfection in which skeptical suspension of judgment leads to tranquility and a sense of awe before the God who alone knows that from which human beings must "refrain and hold back."

The eighth chapter presents Stern's novel account of Maimonides' view of the purpose of Torah commandments. Stern reiterates here his claim that although Maimonides holds intellectual perfection to be unrealizable for human beings, he nevertheless posits such perfection as an ideal. At the same time, Stern suggests, Maimonides shifts his focus from the ideal of intellectual perfection itself to the kinds of practices he promotes as oriented by that ideal. It is in this context that Stern introduces Maimonides' view of Torah commandments as therapeutic exercises. These commandments train Jews to overcome the obstacles that their matter-bound condition puts in the way of proper concentration on the highest human activity, i.e., the all-absorbing intellectual apprehension of the divine. Stern argues that the Guide presents the commandments not as means of divine worship in themselves, but rather as exercises that make the exclusively intellectual worship of God possible, by training followers to occupy themselves with God and the imitation of God rather than with matters pertaining to this world. Through an intriguing claim about Maimonides' conception of the habitual intellect, Stern goes so far as to argue that, for Maimonides, Torah commandments are ontologically transformative: they train that person who has achieved intellectual apprehension of God but yet holds that intellection in habitu to actualize this highest level of human potentiality through exclusive concentration on knowing God. Stern closes the chapter with a reflection on the relation between Maimonides' views regarding the ideal and the need to accommodate the ideal to the human being's matter-bound condition.

The concluding chapter explores Maimonides' discussion of shame as a liberating comportment towards the human being's embodied state. Through a striking, inventive interpretation of two parables that deal with excrement -- one rabbinic, which Maimonides interprets, and one of Maimonides' own invention -- Stern identifies shame as a means Maimonides introduces that allows the human being to dis-identify with her matter-bound condition. Nevertheless, Stern concludes, such a wish to be freed of matter is illusory given the inherent intertwining of form and matter, of intellect and body -- the very condition, Stern has shown, with which the Guide as a whole seeks to help its readers come to terms.

Stern's book is a tremendous achievement. His invocation of Pyrrhonism and his reading of Maimonides' parables as components of spiritual exercises open up the philosophical horizon of the Guide in a way one would not have thought possible after so many generations of commentary and scholarship on Maimonides' thought. Reading Stern's book -- despite its significant length! -- is a thoroughly invigorating and enjoyable intellectual experience. There are nevertheless obstacles in the way of total tranquility here. Most perplexing, to my mind, are the internal tensions that plague Stern's portrait of Maimonides as a quasi-skeptic. Throughout the book, Stern reiterates his claim that Maimonides combines a continued commitment to the ideal of intellectual perfection with Pyrrhonist practices aimed at epoché and a worshipful tranquility. It is unclear to me how these two sides of Stern's Maimonides can coexist coherently. Moreover, the balance between skepticism and the continued drive towards intellectual perfection shifts significantly over the course of the book. Let me address each of these points in turn.

If, as Stern so convincingly suggests, Maimonides' skepticism regularly points to the kind of suspension of judgment yielding tranquility most associated with Pyrrhonism, and is not simply the call for a healthy dose of humility and caution in the pursuit of knowledge, such skepticism does not appear compatible with holding on to the ideal of intellectual perfection. How can I release myself through the skeptical suspension of judgment from the pursuit of metaphysical knowledge, and the anxiety and perplexity that accompanies that pursuit, while at the same time still orienting my life by the ideal of attaining that very same metaphysical knowledge? Someone on the order of Kierkegaard's knight of faith might need to be invoked, it seems to me, in order to model such a combination. Compromise positions are possible, positions that are only mildly skeptical and at once hold out hope for knowledge within a limited domain (e.g., physics). But the epoché and tranquility that characterize Pyrrhonist skepticism, and for which Stern finds such dramatic evidence in the Guide, are not the product of mild skepticism. On the other hand, a modest pursuit of knowledge within defined limits seems to me different from a position that continues to take the ideal of intellectual perfection seriously. (It is possible that a more developed account of what it means for intellectual perfection to serve as a regulative ideal might have helped clarify this matter; but I'm not sure what that account would have to look like.)

In fact, the exact combination of skepticism and continued allegiance to the ideal of intellectual perfection that Stern attributes to Maimonides seems to vary considerably between Stern's discussions of different Maimonidean parables. These differences raise further question about the coherence of the Maimonides that Stern's book projects. Stern's reading of Maimonides' interpretation of the Garden of Eden parable presents the most striking version of Aqibean skepticism, in which recognizing and holding back from the pursuit of metaphysical knowledge yields tranquility. Yet the case of Moses cited at the end of Stern's discussion of metaphysical knowledge in Chapter 4 suggests that suspension of judgment has the capacity to open up "new intellectual resources and powers"(!).

By the time Stern discusses Maimonides' view of the purpose of the commandments in Chapter Eight, the spiritual exercises at stake are aimed entirely at the actualization of the intellectual apprehension of the divine. Here Stern shows Maimonides to be concerned with the gap between the ideal and human necessities, but he nevertheless introduces the commandments as training through which "the intellectually perfected individual" (321) of III:51 can work towards worshipful activation of her (habitual) perfected intellect. "Given the severe limitations" he has shown Maimonides to place "on human knowledge of metaphysics . . . in previous chapters" (316), Stern here considers the possibility that such intellectual worship involves "emptying one's mind of everything not God."

Finally, Stern's discussion of shame suggests yet another permutation of the combination of skepticism and continued commitment to intellectual perfection. Here the recognition of one's matter-bound condition leads one to attempt to dis-identify with one's matter so far as is possible. Fascinating as Stern's discussion of Maimonidean shame is, however, this comportment could not be further from the tranquility Aqiba was said to have attained through the acceptance of his intellectual limitations. In these last chapters of the book, then, the skepticism attributed to Maimonides no longer has Pyrrhonist resonances. It is when Stern's Maimonides is at his least Pyrrhonist that one wonders how much difference there really is between Stern's mitigated skepticism in reading Maimonides and the mitigated dogmatism of those scholars against whom he argues. With Hume's Philo, one is inclined to ask whether "the dispute between the sceptics and dogmatists is entirely verbal, or at least regards only the degrees of doubt and assurance, which we ought to indulge with regard to all reasoning."

Parallel to the tensions that arise within Stern's portrait of a partly-but-not-quite-skeptical Maimonides are questions that should be raised about his account of the Maimonidean parable. Stern distances himself from the standard exoteric/esoteric interpretation of the external and inner parabolic meaning of Maimonidean parables, we saw, by insisting that both such levels in fact convey wisdom, that they do not stand in tension with one another, and that they are not to be distinguished according to their audience such that the masses are fed noble lies while philosophical readers are taught truth. In a number of the parables Stern analyzes in practice, however, the distance between his view and the exoteric/esoteric view does not quite hold. Because the external parabolic meaning often conveys a belief about metaphysics that the inner parabolic meaning undermines in skeptical fashion, a tension between these levels of parabolic meaning often does come to the fore, which mirrors the tension between skepticism and the continued commitment to the ideal of intellectual perfection, which I have touched on.

Two examples will suffice. Since the external parabolic meaning of the Garden of Eden narrative posits intellectual perfection as realizable for human beings, indeed as the capacity according to which human beings are created "in the image of God," it stands in sharp tension with the skeptical inner meaning of the parable which calls for moderation in the pursuit of knowledge, and according to which the quest for intellectual perfection can only appear like the excessive strivings of the rabbinic heretic Aher. Stern himself goes so far as to suggest that the unrealizability of the intellectual ideal promoted by the external meaning of this parable represents an example of Maimonides' seventh kind of contradiction, which must be concealed from the vulgar. Moreover, in his account of Maimonides' discussion of divine attributes we find a similar tension between levels of meaning. Recall that in this context Maimonides' external teaching suggests that attributes of action and negations of privations may be legitimately attributed to God, but according to his inner teaching no statement with subject-predicate syntax can express truth about God. Regarding the relation between these two levels of meaning, Stern writes: "Both external and inner meanings of these chapters agree that negative descriptions are superior to affirmative ones; the question that divides them is whether the negations are not merely better but also true" (200). Such cases in which Maimonides' inner parabolic teaching is shown to undermine an external parabolic teaching meant to promote communal welfare suggest (to this reader, at least) that the gap between Stern's own reading of Maimonidean parables and the exoteric/esoteric reading is not as wide as Stern claims.

The issues I've raised regarding the coherence of the quasi-skeptical position Stern attributes to Maimonides and regarding the relation between levels of meaning in the Maimonidean parable appear to me, more often than not, to stand or fall together: the challenge of showing the compatibility of external and inner levels of parabolic meaning parallels the challenge of showing how the same Maimonides can both adhere to an ideal of intellectual perfection and at once suspend judgment vis-à-vis that ideal and attain skeptical tranquility.

Despite the reservations I've expressed, I hope I've conveyed the significance of the contribution Stern's book makes to Maimonides studies. Stern has blazed a new trail in the interpretation of the Guide. It is only fitting that he has left a few obstacles on that trail that will continue to perplex us.