The Meaning of If

Meaning Of If

Justin Khoo, The Meaning of If, Oxford University Press, 2022, 356pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190096700.

Reviewed by Paolo Santorio, University of Maryland, College Park


If is a simple word that gives rise to hard puzzles. It has been the subject of a vast literature, starting with Robert Stalnaker’s (1968), David Lewis’s (1973a; 1973b), and Angelika Kratzer’s (1986; 2012) classical writings. The last fifteen years have seen a wave of new work on the topic, often growing out of advances in linguistic semantics and formal epistemology. Justin Khoo’s The Meaning of If is one of the most ambitious and comprehensive pieces of work in this new wave. The book suggests a general view about the content of conditionals—conditionals encode inferential dispositions— and implements it in a formal framework, which includes both a compositional semantics and principles for assigning probability to conditionals.

The book is divided into three parts. The first lays out a general semantic and conceptual framework for conditionals, using as a springboard Khoo’s so-called ‘Bounding Puzzle’. The second part shows how this semantic framework can be combined with probability. The third part delves into the difference between subjunctives and indicatives. I will focus here on the first and the third parts.

The book kicks off with what Khoo calls the ‘Bounding Puzzle’. The Bounding Puzzle comes in two versions, one for indicatives and one for subjunctives. In both cases, the gist is the following: three seemingly plausible assumptions about conditionals and updates turn out to be inconsistent.

Here is the indicative version of the Puzzle. Consider the following principles (‘A B’ is shorthand for the indicative conditional If A, then B):

Conditionalization+. Coming to believe A is at least to rule out all possibilities in which A is false.

Strength. It is possible that A B is true and A B is false.

Weak Sufficiency. Coming to accept A B (when you regard A B as possible) is to come to believe nothing more than that A B is true.

All three principles seem plausible. Conditionalization+ is a minimal constraint on learning information. Strength states that indicatives are logically stronger than material conditionals—a principle that any serious compositional semantics for conditionals is bound to vindicate.[1] Weak Sufficiency is a variant of the well-known Or-to-If principle (Stalnaker 1975).[2] For illustration, consider:

(1) a. Alia is in Lisbon or Porto.

     b. If Alia isn’t in Lisbon, she’s in Porto.

Weak Sufficiency says that, when you learn (1a), you learn (1b) and nothing else. This seems plausible. As Khoo asks, what else is it that you learn? Also, learning (1a) invariably puts you in the position to assert (1b) (assuming that it’s possible that Alia is in Porto).

Unfortunately, Conditionalization+, Strength, and Weak Sufficiency are inconsistent. Via Strength, there are possibilities where A B is true and A B is false. Call one such possibility p. Via Conditionalization+, upon learning A B, p is ruled out. But then learning A B is learning something more than merely learning A B, contra Weak Sufficiency.

What gives? To answer, Khoo puts forward some key claims about (i) the content of conditionals and (ii) belief in conditionals.

With regard to content, Khoo suggests that conditionals encode inferential dispositions. In particular, A B encodes the disposition to infer B from A plus a set of known ‘background’ proposition (an epistemic modal base). On the resulting picture, conditionals have contents that are more fine-grained than ordinary propositions—what Khoo calls ‘refined contents’. A refined content determines an ordinary proposition, but not vice versa.

We get a semantics illustrating this in chapter 4. There, building on sequence semantics in the style of Bas Van Fraassen 1976, Khoo suggests that we model contents as sets of sequences of worlds. The first world in the sequence specifies what world is actual; later worlds specify what the subject should infer, should earlier worlds be ruled out (a ‘learning plan’). For example, compare these two sets:

S1 = { <w1, w2, w3, w4>, <w2, w1, w3, w4> }

S2 = { <w1, w2, w4, w3>, <w2, w1, w4, w3> }

S1 and S2 are two refined contents. They determine the same proposition, namely { w1, w2 }. But they encode different inferential dispositions. w3 always appears before w4 in S1; vice versa in S2. Hence S1 encodes the disposition to infer w3 from ¬(w1 w2), while S2 encodes the disposition to infer w4 from ¬(w1 w2).

What is it, then, to believe a conditional? Surprisingly, even though the contents of conditionals are richer than propositions, whether you believe a conditional is fully fixed by your propositional beliefs. This follows from a combination of two principles. First, to believe A B is (roughly) to be disposed to infer B from A, plus the other information in your belief state. Second, an agent is disposed to infer B from A just in case (roughly) their belief state entails A B. So all you need in order to have the disposition to infer B from A, and hence believe A B, is for your beliefs to entail the material conditional A B.[3]

This theory blocks the Bounding Puzzle by diagnosing an equivocation in the interpretation of ‘possibility’. If we interpret ‘possibility’ as ‘possible world’, then Strength fails. There is no world where A B is true and A B is false. To see that A B is stronger, we need to consider the possibilities used to model refined contents, i.e., sequences: then, we’ll notice that there are sequences at which A B is false and A B true. But, if we take ‘possibilities’ to mean ‘sequences’, then Weak Sufficiency fails. One does rule out more sequences upon learning A B than upon learning A B.

This makes for an elegant solution of the indicative Bounding Puzzle. A similarly elegant solution applies to the subjunctive version, which I don’t have the space to discuss here. But solving the Bounding puzzles is not the only merit of Khoo’s theory. I have already mentioned that, starting in chapter 4, Khoo implements the picture in a fully developed compositional semantics. This semantics builds on standard Kratzer-style frameworks for modality, and hence can be easily integrated with a general semantic theory for natural language. In addition, in chapters 5 and 6, Khoo shows how it can be combined with a probability theory that vindicates a version of Stalnaker’s Thesis—which, stated informally, is the thesis that the probability of A B equals the conditional probability of B, given A. This is remarkable, because Stalnaker’s Thesis has often been taken to be untenable in the light of so-called triviality results (see Lewis 1976, among others). In a very comprehensive discussion, Khoo shows how his theory blocks triviality.

Several other recent accounts in the literature vindicate versions of Stalnaker’s Thesis and block triviality using sequence semantics. (Besides Van Fraassen 1976, see for example Kaufmann 2009, Bacon 2015, Goldstein & Santorio 2021.) But Khoo’s account is original in a number of ways. In particular, the idea of interpreting sequences via inferential dispositions is a distinctive feature of his account.[4] So, while the formal architecture of Khoo’s theory is shared with other accounts in the literature, the conceptual apparatus associated with the formalism is altogether new.

At the same time, the link between conditionals and inferential dispositions is one of the potential points of pressure on the theory. What exactly are ‘inferential dispositions’? As Khoo himself points out, S having the disposition to infer B from A cannot boil down to the truth of the counterfactual if S believed A, S would believe B. For a counterexample, consider:

(2) If my business partner were cheating me, I would never find out.

Believing (2) (and hence having the relevant inferential disposition) doesn’t mean that, if you came to believe its antecedent, you would come to believe its consequent.[5] But, if inferential dispositions cannot be understood in terms of counterfactuals, how should they be understood? Khoo doesn’t answer this question explicitly.

Here is what I suspect: insofar as we have a grip on the relevant notion of an inferential disposition, it is just via our grip on the meaning of conditionals. So explaining conditionals in terms of inferential dispositions is circular. Even if this is correct, I don’t think it dooms Khoo’s theory. It is still informative to link conditionals to dispositions of a certain sort. At the same time, it makes the explanatory gain of appealing to dispositions more modest than it may seem at first.

A second worry concerns the generality of the Bounding Puzzle. Khoo’s solution crucially relies on assuming principles concerning belief in conditionals. But analogs of Weak Sufficiency seem to hold for all sorts of attitudes. Some examples include supposing, desiring, and hoping. In all these cases, coming to have the relevant attitude towards A B seems to involve coming to have no more than the relevant attitude towards A B. As evidence for this, notice that all the following inferences are fine.[6]

(3) Suppose that Alia is in Lisbon or Porto.

       ⊧ Suppose that, if Alia isn’t in Lisbon, she’s in Porto.

(4) Bashir wants to go to Lisbon or Porto.

       ⊧ Bashir wants to go to Porto, if he doesn’t go to Lisbon.

(5) Bashir hopes that Alia is in Lisbon or Porto.

       ⊧ Bashir hopes that, if Alis isn’t in Lisbon, she’s in Porto.

So far as I can see, the solution for Khoo would be to endorse a series of principles analogous to the ones he endorses about believing conditionals. For example, for the case of supposition, he could endorse the principle that an agent supposes A B just in case they are disposed to infer B from A ‘within the scope’ of the supposition. This might work, but at the price of adding to the theory a series of extra principles.

Notice also that the principle doesn’t generalize to all attitudes. For example, the analog of Weak Sufficiency fails for confidence: becoming confident of A B amounts to more than becoming confident of the corresponding material conditional. Consider the inference:

(6) Bashir is confident that Alia is in Lisbon or Porto.

       ⊧ Bashir is confident that, if Alia isn’t in Lisbon, she’s in Porto.

Bashir might have credence .7 that Alia is in Lisbon, .1 that she’s in Porto, and .2 that she’s not in Portugal at all. Then the premise of (6) is true and the conclusion false.

Hence we are in the following situation: Weak Sufficiency appears to generalize to a number of other attitudes (though not to attitudes across the board). This will give rise to other instances of the Bounding Puzzle. So we will need to generalize the theory to handle them. Maybe this can be done in a fairly conservative way, and we can hold on to a view on which inferential dispositions play a central role. But maybe not. Maybe we will need to bring in machinery of a different sort, and inferential dispositions will not play center stage in explaining the puzzle in a fully general theory.

Let me move to the third part of the book. There Khoo discusses the difference between indicative and subjunctive conditionals. It is well-known that the two types of conditionals differ in their truth conditions, as is illustrated by well-known minimal pairs like (7):

(7) a. If Oswald didn’t kill Kennedy, someone else did.

      b. If Oswald hadn’t killed Kennedy, someone else would have.

Following common lore, Khoo suggests that this difference is explained by a difference in modal flavor. Indicatives express epistemic modality, while subjunctives express metaphysical modality. In particular, subjunctives quantify over historical alternatives of the world of evaluation w at a certain time t, i.e., worlds that are “intrinsically just like w up until t while possibly differing thereafter”.

More controversially, Khoo suggests that we can derive this difference in flavor from facts about tense, plus a general pragmatic principle:

Avoid Trivialization: Interpret a complex sentence so that it is not epistemically equivalent with any of its sentential constituents.

Avoid Trivialization is both natural from a broadly Gricean perspective, and empirically supported. Disjunctions where one disjunct entails the other (so-called ‘Hurford disjunctions’), like (8) are infelicitous (see Chierchia 2013, Katzir & Singh 2014):

(8) John is in Paris or in France.

Avoid Trivialization explains this infelicity in a very simple way: the speaker could have conveyed the same content by uttering just the left disjunct.

Khoo’s idea is that we can use Avoid Trivialization to derive the following generalization (roughly): when the consequent of a conditional is about the past or the present, the conditional is always epistemic. For illustration, consider:

(9) If Alia is in Porto, Bashir is in Lisbon.

Khoo’s theory predicts (correctly) that (9) only has an epistemic reading. Suppose for reductio that we interpret (9) as quantifying over historical possibilities. (9) says that, in all open historical possibilities where Alia is in Porto, Bashir is in Lisbon. But the possibilities in the domain of (9) agree on all facts up to the present (though they may diverge about the future). So, if Bashir is in Lisbon in some of those possibilities, then he’s in Lisbon in all of them. This means that (9) is true just in case its consequent is, which violates Avoid Trivialization. So (9) must have an epistemic reading.

The philosophical literature on conditionals has often neglected issues of morphology. This is a serious shortcoming. Work in semantics in the last twenty or so years has shown that morphological details are crucial for determining a number of features of modals, including features that philosophers seriously care about, such as whether a modal is epistemic or metaphysical. So it’s a real merit of Khoo’s book that he devotes serious attention to the interaction between tense and modality.

At the same time, I am skeptical that Khoo’s particular account is correct. First, Avoid Trivialization is controversial; some theorists have argued that it is too strong. The basic problem is that it seems to be clearly violated by some sentences, in particular conjunctions:[7]

(10) Zahia is pregnant and she’s expecting a girl.

Second, Avoid Trivialization has, at best, the status of an overridable default, whereas facts about modal flavor seem hardwired in grammar. To see that Avoid Trivialization is overridable, consider the following examples:

(11) A: Alia doesn’t believe that Bashir is in Berlin.

        B: Well, even if Alia doesn’t believe it, Bashir is in Berlin.

(12) Alia is in Paris if Bashir is in Paris, and she’s in Paris also if he’s not. Her decision to go was completely independent of Bashir’s.

In both (11) and (12), a conditional (or a pair thereof) is uttered in a context in which the consequent is believed to be true by the speaker. For example, in (11), the speaker clearly believes that Bashir is in Berlin (and is using just the conditional to convey that). So it looks like Avoid Trivialization is overridable. This is not surprising: Avoid Trivialization is a pragmatic principle, and pragmatic principles often have the status of overridable defaults. But the fact that conditionals like (9) have epistemic flavor is not an overridable default. Rather, it is hardwired in grammar, and not something that we can easily manipulate with context. So I’m skeptical that an adequate explanation of the flavor of conditionals will rest on principles like Avoid Trivialization.

There is way more in this book than a reviewer can hope to discuss; so I need to stop. But in closing, let me emphasize that the book is rich, comprehensive, and very interesting. The theory Khoo defends is ambitious and blends in an original way formalism and a general philosophical view of the meaning of conditionals. It will be mandatory reading for anyone working on conditionals and modality in the coming years.


Thanks to Fabrizio Cariani and Justin Khoo for helpful discussion.


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[1] Of course, Strength is rejected by supporters of the material conditional analysis, on which indicative conditionals just are the realization of material conditionals in natural language. This analysis is periodically resurrected by some illustrious contrarian; see Grice 1989, Lewis 1976, Jackson 1987, Williamson 2020. Defenders of the material conditional analysis get out of the Bounding puzzle—at the price of buying into other, more serious problems.

[2] Or-to-If is the principle that accepting A B (or, equivalently, ¬ A B) is sufficient for accepting A B (assuming that A B is possible). One important difference between Weak Sufficiency and Or-to-If is that Or-to-If is a constraint on static acceptance states, whereas Weak Sufficiency concerns learning.

[3] Both principles are stated approximately; the actual principles that Khoo endorses are:

Conditional Belief

S believes a conditional A m B iff for each w BEL S : S is disposed to infer B from mAw.

Factual Determination

An agent S is disposed to infer B from A iff

a. A is compatible with S’s factual beliefs and A B is entailed by them, or

b. A is incompatible with S’s factual beliefs and A B.

[4] Other sequence-based semantics interpret sequences as the result of an infinite number of ‘random draws’ of worlds (Van Fraassen 1976, see Kaufmann 2009, Bacon 2015); or as the result of running supervaluational reasoning over the worlds in an information state (Santorio 2022, Goldstein & Santorio 2021).

[5] One might try to invoke accounts of dispositions that are not based on counterfactuals (see e.g., Vetter 2014), but so far as I can see that won’t help.

[6] For the related point that Or-to-If holds also in embeddings, see Boylan & Schultheis 2022.

[7] For some recent discussion, see among others Mayr & Romoli 2016, Marty & Romoli 2022.