The Meaning of 'Ought': Beyond Descriptivism and Expressivism in Metaethics

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Matthew Chrisman, The Meaning of 'Ought': Beyond Descriptivism and Expressivism in Metaethics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 260pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199363001.

Reviewed by David Killoren, Northwestern University


Matthew Chrisman has developed an innovative, sophisticated, and plausible set of views about the meaning of 'ought.' This book is a major contribution in metaethics. It ought to be widely read and carefully studied.

The book is dense and detailed, but not excessively long. There is a fair bit of symbolic formalization, but each formalized rule is accompanied by an informal gloss, which ensures that the book will be useful even for those who think and talk in plain English. In this review, I'll stick to plain English. Disclaimer: My discussion of Chrisman's work will be less rigorous than the work itself. Occasionally Chrisman humbly states that he can only offer a first approximation of the truth; but in my discussion here, I'll only deal in first approximations of Chrisman's first approximations. My aim is just to explain a few of Chrisman's main arguments, and to offer a few objections along the way.

Before I can get into the meat of Chrisman's position, I'll need to first discuss the distinction between semantics and metasemantics, as this distinction guides much of Chrisman's work. Semantics deals with meaning and truth-conditions; Chrisman is particularly interested in compositional semantics, which concerns the contribution that semantic units (e.g., words) make to the content of semantically more complex entities (e.g., sentences). In particular, Chrisman wants to formulate rules by which to determine the contribution that 'ought' makes to the semantic content of ought-claims in English. Thus, in the parts of the book dealing with semantics (primarily chapters 2-5), Chrisman considers a series of different semantic rules for 'ought,' and ultimately argues (however tentatively) in favor of one of them.

By contrast with semantics, metasemantics tries to interpret semantic theories, and specifically tries to explain what it is in virtue of which words and sentences (and other such things) have the meanings and truth-conditions that they do. Chrisman's aim is to develop both a semantics and a metasemantics of 'ought.' One of Chrisman's important methodological contributions is to argue that we can and should develop a metasemantically neutral semantics for 'ought.' And so in the final chunk of the book (chapters 6-7), he presents and defends a metasemantic interpretation of the semantic theory developed in earlier chapters.

In order to lay out Chrisman's semantic theory, it's useful to begin with a point that he raises early in the book. Most philosophers accept that there are (or appear to be) many different "flavors" of ought-claims: moral (e.g., "We ought to do more to relieve great suffering"), prudential (e.g., "Jay ought to give up smoking"), teleological (e.g., "To kill quietly, poison rather than an ax ought to be used"), evaluative ("There ought not be childhood death and disease"), epistemic ("The storm ought to hit shore before midnight"), and so on. This observation might lead one to expect that there will be just as many different meanings of 'ought' as there are flavors of ought-claims. However, as he notes, dictionary definitions of 'ought' do not usually divide 'ought' into five (or more) flavors. Rather, lexicographers apparently assume a minimal number of semantic rules for 'ought,' and Chrisman thinks (for various reasons) that we should follow them in that regard. Therefore, he sets out to develop a holistic account that will reveal a semantic unity underlying 'ought' in its many flavors.

There is a number of different ways to develop such a holistic account; one possibility (which I'll discuss again below) is to provide an analysis of 'ought' in terms of reasons. But Chrisman finds fault with reasons analyses, and develops his own view as an alternative. According to the view that he ultimately defends, there are two sorts of ought-claims: agentive ought-claims, which concern what a specific agent ought to do; and nonagentive ought-claims, which concern what ought to be the case. Every ought-claim has a prejacent: in the case of agentive ought-claims, the prejacent is (what Chrisman calls) a practition (i.e., roughly, the non-propositional content of an imperative); in the case of nonagentive ought-claims, the prejacent is a proposition. For example, on Chrisman's account, "Bill ought to kiss Lucy" is an agentive ought-claim, and its prejacent is Bill, (to) kiss Lucy -- a practition. By contrast, "Lucy ought to be kissed by Bill" is a nonagentive ought-claim, and its prejacent is that Lucy is kissed by Bill -- a proposition.

Chrisman argues that the meaning of nonagentive ought-claims can be spelled out in terms of possible worlds. In developing this view, he draws heavily from prior work by Angelika Kratzer on the semantics of modals. Two notions (both due to Kratzer) are central to the theory Chrisman defends: that of a modal base, and that of an ordering source.

To illustrate the idea, suppose someone says "Everyone ought to drink at least two liters of water a day." To evaluate this claim as either true or false, we first need a modal base, which is fixed by context. The modal base is a set of worlds in which certain background conditions are met; these worlds are called the f-worlds. The background conditions vary by context; but typically, the f-worlds will be those worlds that resemble the actual world in all respects relevant for actual-world decision-making purposes.

Next, we need an ordering source g. The ordering source will depend on the flavor of whatever ought-claim is in question, and the flavor of the ought-claim will vary depending on context. If the ought-claim has a moral flavor, then the ordering source will presumably be a set of moral values, moral principles, or what-have-you. If the ought-claim has a prudential flavor, then the ordering source will be self-interest (that of the speaker, presumably, or perhaps that of the audience). And so on. The ordering source g will vary depending on flavor, but in all cases the function of the ordering source is to rank f-worlds, i.e., worlds in the modal base. (This ranking may be only partial.) The result is that the ordering source will determine a set of "g-rific f-worlds" -- worlds in the modal base that are highly ranked according to the ordering source. (Chrisman cites Janice Dowell as the source of that catchy phrase, "g-rific f-worlds.")

Chrisman's Kratzerian theory says that a given proposition p ought to be true, in any given context of utterance, iff p is true in all of the g-rific f-worlds. So, sticking with our example, "Everyone ought to drink at least two liters of water a day" comes out as true iff its prejacent -- the proposition that everyone drinks at least two liters of water a day -- is true at all of the g-rific -worlds. Whether or not that proposition is in fact true at all of the g-rific f-worlds is determined by the functions g and f, and these are fixed by context.

A principal advantage of this account is that it allows us to provide a functional description of the semantics of nonagentive ought-claims that can cover all flavors of 'ought.' On this account, different flavors of 'ought' rely on different ordering sources -- a moral ought-claim relies on a moral ordering source, a prudential ought claim relies on a prudential ordering source, etc. -- but in each case, as long as the ought-claim in question is nonagentive, the ordering source will play essentially the same role in determining truth or falsity of the ought-claim. Chrisman's account can even handle epistemic ought-claims, if we suppose that the ordering source is, in epistemic contexts, to be spelled out in terms of likelihood, or some such epistemically relevant property. This flexibility in his Kratzerian account of 'ought' lends his view significant plausibility if we are on board with Chrisman's idea that an acceptable semantics for 'ought' should unify the different flavors of 'ought.'

As noted above, Chrisman distinguishes two sorts of ought-claims -- agential and nonagential. He argues that practitions play a role in agentive ought-claims that is structurally similar to the role that propositions play in nonagentive ought-claims, and he offers a single formalized rule to handle both agentive and nonagentive ought-claims (148).

Before I move on to Chrisman's metasemantics, I want to express a niggling worry about the relation of reasons to 'ought.' Ought-claims are typically advanced in the light of reasons. We expect moral ought-claims to be supported by moral reasons (and we typically disbelieve a moral ought-claim if it cannot be supported by moral reasons); likewise, prudential ought-claims are supposed to be supported by prudential reasons; epistemic ought-claims are supposed to be supported by (or, at least, importantly connected with) epistemic reasons; and so on. Given that ought-claims of all flavors seem to be tightly related to reasons, it would be natural to try to develop an analysis of 'ought' in terms of reasons. And in fact, as mentioned above, Chrisman considers this angle (and provides useful discussion of how to pursue it). But he provides two different arguments against the possibility of an adequate reasons analysis (51-2).

In the first argument, he says that when a child learns the meaning of 'ought,' she does not need to first acquire facility with reasons concepts (especially not complex notions such as conclusive reason, justifying reason, etc.). Instead, children first learn about 'ought,' and learn about reasons later on -- and may even come to understand reasons in terms of 'ought,' rather than vice versa. This, he thinks, is at odds with the idea that 'ought' can be analyzed in terms of reasons.

However, it's not obvious to me that children actually do learn about 'ought' before they learn about reasons, and Chrisman offers no evidence for that claim. Further, it is not clear why his own view wouldn't suffer from the same problem: after all, children are not taught about possible worlds before they learn how to use 'ought.' In fact, many people may never learn to talk about possible worlds (except perhaps tacitly, via words like 'might,' 'cannot,' etc.) whereas most people, even children, talk explicitly about reasons. So, it may be that Chrisman's line of objection to the reasons analysis might actually be more forceful (if it is forceful at all) against Chrisman's own view than against the reasons analysis.

His second argument against the reasons analysis of 'ought' is that it cannot support a satisfactory account of the semantic relation between 'ought,' 'must,' and 'may.' The argument here is a bit unclear to me, but part of it seems to go like this: The best reasons analysis of 'ought' implies that ought-claims are about conclusive reasons; but must-claims are probably also about conclusive reasons; so, the reasons analysis of 'ought' will leave us without a way to distinguish 'ought' from 'must.' If that's the argument, I don't think it is fully persuasive. After all, in general, it is possible for two different pieces of language to be distinguishable at the semantic level even if they are about the same thing. Consider 'warm' and 'hot' -- both are about heat, yet we can distinguish them.

Thus, I'm not fully satisfied by Chrisman's case against the reasons analysis. And I think that the reasons analysis might be among the best available alternatives to his view. So there is plenty of room for defenders of the reasons analysis to engage in fruitful debate with Chrisman and his allies.

As noted above, Chrisman moves in the final chapters of the book to metasemantics. His aim here is to interpret the truth conditions given by the semantic theory defended earlier. He considers three possible views: a descriptivist view, which is "naturally allied" with a kind of representationalism according to which truth conditions articulate the way that ought-sentences represent reality as being; an expressivist view, "naturally allied" with an ideationism according to which truth conditions articulate a thought conventionally expressed by ought-claims; and inferentialism, according to which truth conditions "articulate a position in a space of implications that determine the inferentially articulable commitments implicitly undertaken or acknowledged by canonical use of [ought-claims]." In staking out his own preferred position, Chrisman is cautious. He does not take these three options to be strictly exclusive. He allows that the truth conditions of ought-sentences might have representationalist, ideationist, and inferentialist roles or dimensions. But his view is that "the inferentialist metasemantics offers a better account of what grounds the meaningfulness of sentences in mature human languages" (160). Chrisman is partial to an expansive version of inferentialism that goes well beyond 'ought,' but his efforts in this book are aimed squarely at defending an inferentialism about 'ought' in particular. Here Chrisman is developing a pragmatist view inspired by the work of Robert Brandom and others in that vein.

As we've seen, Chrisman's semantics implies that ought-claims are semantically analyzable in terms of possible worlds. He uses this semantics in order to argue against metasemantic representationalism. Given his semantics, a straightforward representationalist account of 'ought' would imply that ought-claims represent reality as containing possible worlds. On such an account, there are true ought-claims only if possible worlds are real. But that seems problematic. Surely we can make everyday ought-claims without taking a stand on the controversial issue of the reality of possible worlds. This is not to deny that possible worlds are real; the point instead is that we can make ought-claims while remaining neutral on the ontological status of possible worlds. Thus, Chrisman argues, if we are going to be metasemantic representationalists at all, then we'll need to devise some kind of sophisticated representationalism that somehow avoids burdening ought-claims with a commitment to a controversial possible worlds ontology. From there, Chrisman goes on to cast doubt on whether it's possible to develop an ontologically skimpy representationalism of the needed sort. And then he turns to the question of how to develop an anti-representationalist metasemantics, and argues that the best options in that direction are more likely to be inferentialist than ideationist.

Before I conclude, I want to raise an issue about one part of Chrisman's case against representationalism. I think he is right that representationalism, together with his semantics, implies that there are true ought-claims only if possible worlds are somehow real. But I think this might sound worse than it need be. After all, if we say that possible worlds are real, this doesn't automatically commit us to Lewisian modal realism. For instance, as Chrisman (briefly) acknowledges (170), the representationalist can argue that possible worlds are real but are merely abstracta, and thus belong to a fundamentally different ontological category than the actual world, which is concrete. This is just one of several options for the representationalist; a thorough inventory of all such options may reveal that a representationalist commitment to the reality of possible worlds is more plausible than Chrisman's treatment suggests (although I must emphasize that I haven't covered Chrisman's full critique of representationalism here).

In this review, I've touched on a few of Chrisman's fascinating arguments, though I've been unable to cover the vast majority of what he has to say. The book is deep and contains many extraordinarily valuable resources. It ought to receive wide attention from metaethicists and other philosophers interested in normativity.